Liberal Self-Determination in a World of Migration

Liberal Self Determination In A World Of Migration

Luara Ferracioli, Liberal Self-Determination in a World of Migration, Oxford University Press, 2022, 192pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190056070.

Reviewed by David Miller, University of Oxford


The main question tackled in Luara Ferracioli’s engaging and argument-packed book is whether a liberal state that wants to be true to its own principles of freedom and equality can pursue a selective immigration policy, rather than opening its borders to all comers. That of course is what liberal states actually do, but many philosophical critics have argued that such exclusionary policies are bound to fail the liberal test. Ferracioli thinks otherwise. Her argument has two parts to it. First, she needs to show that it is important to liberal states that they should have the right to control their borders and select among those wanting to cross them. She does this by appeal to the principle of liberal self-determination. Then she has to specify the conditions under which a selective immigration policy can be morally permissible. In particular she has to ward off the charge that such a policy invariably violates the rights of some would-be immigrants.

This is a challenging agenda, requiring not just analytical skill, but also some courage, since anyone defending a position of this kind is liable to be faced with some moral grandstanding on behalf of the excluded migrants. I should declare an interest, since I am broadly sympathetic to Ferracioli’s position, and frequently cited in the book. So, I will focus mainly on points where I find her argument less than fully convincing.

The book begins in an unexpected place, with an explanation of why children who are born and raised in a state have the right to become citizens of that state. This is, of course, something that we normally take for granted, but it becomes an issue for Ferracioli because some of the reasons we might give for this practice would also have implications that she wants to resist for the treatment of immigrants. As it has been wittily put, if arrivals by stork are automatically entitled to citizenship, why not arrivals by boat? Ferracioli appeals to the state’s paternalistic duty to protect the interests of children who are already resident on its territory, which she claims can only be discharged by giving them full rights of citizenship.

She then turns to the issue of citizenship for resident adults who have moved to the state. Here she is critical of social membership arguments developed by Ayelet Shachar, Joseph Carens, and Rainer Bauböck, and proposes instead an autonomy-based theory, focusing on the conditions under which people are able to pursue their individual life-plans with a reasonable degree of security. She argues that ‘citizenship gives people the best shot at living in a liberal state on an ongoing basis’. One might wonder, though, why citizenship rights, which include rights of political participation, must necessarily offer more than secure residence rights, if what is at issue is the ability to pursue one’s private life plan. According to Ferracioli, ‘under current socio-political conditions, only citizens enjoy robust protection of their right to permanent residency and political participation, because only citizens reliably access a number of core legal rights irrespective of the politics of the day’ (39).

The worry, then, is that an unpopular minority with residence rights only might find themselves stripped of some or all of these rights as the political mood darkens. But this could happen to citizens too. Jews in Nazi Germany were citizens until new laws introduced in 1935 stripped them of their rights. There is, unfortunately, no way of giving people a cast-iron guarantee that they will be able to continue living in their chosen place and pursuing their projects without interruption. The politics of the day is inescapable. In a well-functioning liberal state, those with legal rights of residence have adequate security of tenure. In a state like Nazi Germany, nobody does, regardless of their legal status.

This suggests that the case for allowing all permanent residents in a state access to citizenship cannot be made simply by appeal to the conditions under which people can pursue their private projects securely. More has to be said about the significance of having political rights, over and above their protective function. The argument that is often given here is relational in form, and appeals to equality: having within the society a sub-class of people who are permanently excluded from having political rights subordinates these people to the citizen majority. They become, in the classic phrase, ‘mere auxiliaries to the commonwealth’. It is not clear to me why Ferracioli avoids making use of this argument, which has a liberal pedigree, if not exactly from the same stable as the one she does deploy. Perhaps she thinks that it overstates the symbolic significance of having full rights of citizenship.

We come next to Ferracioli’s claim that liberal states have a right of self-determination that entails their having the right to exclude immigrants. She is keen to stress that the value at stake is liberal self-determination. What does that mean? It is first of all self-determination that aims to protect the conditions for freedom and equality within the state. But that cannot be all, since it would be hard to explain on that basis why it was justifiable to exclude immigrants. It would have to be shown that admitting migrants somehow threatens the liberal character of the society going forward, and this looks implausible. So Ferracioli’s conception of self-determination has to be thicker than this, as indeed it is. She emphasizes that each society will have different collective projects that it wants to pursue. Self-determination matters, because, as she puts it, ‘citizens care a great deal about working things out for themselves, especially in light of the fact that each liberal state has its own unique history, territory, set of natural resources, widely held public norms, and set of public institutions’ (58).

Controlling immigration then becomes important, because of the impact that accommodating immigrants is likely to have on the success of those projects. Examples might include social justice concerns—providing all citizens with housing, education, health care, etc.; cultural concerns—protecting a national language; and environmental concerns—protecting biodiversity hotspots from encroachment. Ferracioli’s assumption is that where admitting immigrants in large numbers can be shown to have a negative impact on the success of such policies, self-determination trumps the interests of the immigrants themselves—unless the immigrants have special claims, discussed later in the book.

Before looking at the constraints to which a liberal immigration policy should be subject, it is worth reflecting a little further on the defence of self-determination being offered here. Ferracioli seems to assume that there will be a broad consensus on the policies in question. This may be so, but there are almost certain to be dissenters, who object either to the projects themselves, or to the state being used as the vehicle to pursue them. In other words, in practice these are likely to be projects that reflect either the thicker conceptions of justice, or the cultural values, of the majority of citizens. While this does not make them illiberal in a broad sense, it does set them somewhat at odds with the neutralist form of liberalism that becomes prominent in later chapters of the book.

Putting it very simply, you cannot justify restricting immigration just by referring to freedom and equality (unless you are willing to demonize immigrants by portraying them as dangers to these values). You must say that citizens are entitled to pursue aims that they have decided collectively are worth pursuing, whatever these might be, and have the right to limit the number joining their society for that reason. I think this is actually Ferracioli’s view (and one that I share), but it is something of a stretch to call it a liberal idea of self-determination.

Ferracioli’s liberalism comes out much more clearly when turning to the constraints on what can count as a morally permissible immigration policy. There are people whom it is obligatory to admit—refugees, especially—and others whom it is obligatory not to admit—people who would form part of a brain drain whose consequence is that the human rights of those they leave behind (such as their right to health care) go unfulfilled. Each of these categories is given its own chapter, as is the category of ‘family reunification immigrants’ which I will turn to briefly below. Before that I want to explore a central theme of the book, which is how to explain the wrongfulness of a discriminatory immigration policy—for example, one that selects people for entry, or excludes them, on the basis of race or religion.

The problem here is easy to state: if states have a right to exclude, and immigrants have no right to be admitted, corresponding to a duty on the part of states to admit them, why is it wrongful to select immigrants for admission on a discriminatory basis? Within domestic society, one might appeal to a right to equal treatment, but it is much less clear that this also applies to the admission of outsiders.

Ferracioli is critical of the two answers most often given in reply to this question. One points to the impact of a discriminatory admissions policy on citizens of the receiving society who belong to the category being selected against—e.g., Muslims in the US if a ‘Muslim ban’ is being applied to immigrants. A problem with this answer is that it cannot explain why it would be wrong to exclude a small ethnic group which so far has sent no migrants to the state in question. Another answer claims that it is insulting or demeaning to the immigrants who are turned away to be told that they are being excluded on the basis of their race or religion. This looks more promising by virtue of being better targeted, but Ferracioli argues that there are policies that are wrongful without being insulting, and conversely policies that may be experienced as insulting that are not wrongful—such as policies that impose an age restriction on immigrants for economic reasons, which older prospective migrants might find insulting. Here I think it is worth exploring the idea that the relevant sense of ‘insult’ is not captured just by looking at the insulted individual’s emotional response. It seems plausible, for example, that someone can speak to me in a way that is objectively insulting, but I refuse to take offence, either because I’m simply resilient—water off a duck’s back—or because I have no regard for the offender. Discriminatory immigration policy could be insulting because of the message it conveys regardless of how that message is received by its victims.

Ferracioli’s own answer to the question is given very briefly and harder to pin down. She says simply that ‘immigration policy that is discriminatory is not liberal. . . . A liberal state does not have the right to endorse arbitrary criteria for the bestowal of benefits that can make an important difference in how well someone’s life will go as a whole’ (59–60). But that seems merely to repeat the intuition that we are trying to explain. Virtually everyone agrees that discriminatory immigration policy is wrongful; the problem is to show why it is wrongful. Just saying that it is inconsistent with liberal principles seems to beg the question. Ferracioli must allow liberal states a considerable degree of latitude in deciding whom to admit, given the importance she attaches to self-determination. It is, for example, acceptable for them to choose to admit computer programmers in preference to conceptual artists, even though the artists might claim that this was arbitrary. We want to be able to explain why this is permissible, even if it might be misjudged, whereas selecting Christians in preference to Muslims is not.

The question of what counts as an arbitrary admission criterion reappears in one of the most fascinating chapters of the book, on family reunification. Ferracioli uses pairs of examples to show that family ties (such as wife-husband, parent-child) are often a poor indicator of the depth and significance of a relationship. So why don’t citizens have a claim to bring in their most meaningful others regardless of familial connection, for example, their creative partners? Of course there is a practical problem: ‘bureaucrats would need to assess whether or not relationships are genuine and valuable, without relying solely on birth and marriage certificates’ (110). Reflecting on this issue, we might conclude that a legally enforceable immigration policy will never be able to capture the exact moral weight of individual claims for admission. It has to deal in categories that can be applied by bureaucrats and border guards. By way of analogy, the laws of war may, for good reason, be somewhat at odds with what philosophers have called the deep morality of war.

There is much more in this rich book than I have been able to cover in my review. Ferracioli grapples successfully with the challenges involved in formulating a liberal theory of migration and is not afraid of biting bullets when the need arises. She takes the discussion forward from the debates that arose in the first wave of philosophical thinking about migration, initiated especially by Carens’s 2013 book The Ethics of Immigration, and she does so in a way that is both clear and engaging. Everyone working on topics connected to self-determination and immigration will benefit from a close reading of this book, and come away with new questions to address, as well as new answers to contemplate.