Liberalism and Capitalism

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Ellen Frankel Paul, Fred D. Miller Jr., and Jeffrey Paul (eds.), Liberalism and Capitalism, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 308pp., $36.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107640269.

Reviewed by Michael Milde, Western University, Canada


This is a fairly wide ranging collection of eleven essays[1] that needs its expansive title to contain its disparate elements. Relatively little ties these papers together; they address a variety of themes that will be of general interest to a broad range of liberal theorists.

The first three articles in the collection come closest to offering an extended treatment of a single theme -- the historical transformation of liberal thought. In particular, they address the shift from so-called "classical" to "contemporary" liberalism and whether this is a good thing. Alan Kors, in "The Paradox of John Stuart Mill" sees Mill as the pivotal (and equivocal) figure in this process. Kors admires the Mill of On Liberty and The Subjection of Women, who advocates robust individual freedom as the cornerstone for both individual and societal progress. But Kors argues that in his later writings (particularly The Principles of Political Economy) Mill falters and betrays the commitment to liberty in his treatment of economic rights. For Mill, economic production was a natural, necessary process. But the distribution of the results of production was to be determined by "social expediency" tied to the maximization of utility. Mill was concerned to allow government's scope to address issues of equality of opportunity, poor relief, protection of the vulnerable and so on. Kors claims that Mill's views on production gave away the keys to the liberal kingdom by giving theoretical warrant to social engineering by governments -- individual liberty was effectively sacrificed to social control.

In "Capitalism in the Classical and High Liberal Traditions" Samuel Freeman offers a much more positive reading of Mill, treating him as the key transitional figure who tempered the narrow, "classical" liberal focus on natural (and property) rights with considerations of fairness and equality. This gave rise to the "high liberal" tradition associated with Dewey, Rawls and Dworkin. Freeman notes that liberals of all stripes endorse certain familiar, fundamental commitments: to freedom of expression, conscience and association, to participation in democratic institutions, to security of the person, and so on. But they diverge on the place and import of property rights. Here Freeman, contra Kors, endorses Mill's discussion of production and distribution. High liberals came to understand that the distribution of wealth depends on social institutions. The classical liberal contention that distribution must simply track marginal contribution to production is undermined by the discovery that the determination of what counts as a "contribution" depends on social conventions and interpretations. It then falls to political theorists to offer an analysis of these conventions, whose economic consequences have such profound effects on people's lives. High liberals answer this challenge by proposing equality and equality of opportunity as conceptual constraints on individual liberty in the economic realm. Freeman concludes that high liberals need not reject market outcomes or capitalism, but these elements must be justified by concepts of justice grounded in fairness and equality.

Ronald Pestritto develops a similar line of analysis in "Founding Liberalism, Progressive Liberalism and the Rights of Property" but comes at it from a more straightforwardly political angle. Founding liberalism is associated with the early history of the American Constitution and relies on a recognizably Lockean conception of individual and property rights. Progressive liberals, including John Dewey, Woodrow Wilson, Frank Goodnow and Theodore Roosevelt challenged this understanding of rights, in order to advance a range of social causes ranging from working conditions to political equality. Their key conceptual tool was the idea of "historical contingency": rights (including property rights) cannot be understood as timeless and immutable, despite the rhetoric employed in the Constitution and the Declaration of Independence. Instead, the rights explicitly or implicitly enunciated are only relevant to a time and context. As times change (industrialization takes hold, the population expands, demands for universal franchise emerge), the original commitments lose meaning and can become tools for obstructing needed, democratically desired, social change. Pestritto also shows how this theoretical debate played out in the political practice of Theodore and Franklin Roosevelt and their hostile interactions with a Supreme Court that hewed to the tenets of Founding Liberalism.

In this trio of papers, Freeman and Pestritto get the better of the exchange. Kors's preference for the simple primacy of individual liberty needs to confront the influence of social context and interpretation. To privilege individual liberty is not to pre-empt social interpretation. It is to choose one social interpretation over another, and this choice will have to be justified. Kors's nostalgia for the early Mill will not suffice.

In the collection's most philosophically ambitious essay, Gerald Gaus claims that contemporary political philosophy is mired in ideology. Theorists construct grand theories to support their own social/political views, with little convergence or engagement with other views. This is motivated by two competing orientations, the first of which privileges individual conscience (so that personal convictions become politically authoritative) while the second makes individual conviction subordinate to the political authority of the state (a view Gaus attributes to the contractarian tradition of Hobbes, Locke and Kant). Gaus's strategy for dealing with the impasse is straightforward: rather than starting from first principles, theorists need to engage existing social principles, treating them as norms that enjoy broad support and legitimacy. This approach has to face the challenge of what Rawls called "the fact of pluralism" -- the deep disagreement about the value and interpretation of social norms. Gaus suggests that it is possible to use basic game theoretic concepts to show that everyone has reason to endorse some scheme of primitive property rights. However, this arrangement will work only if there is a transition from a "property equilibrium" (where property rights make sense) to a "moral equilibrium" where individuals treat property rights as morally right. Without this shift, the property equilibrium would be vulnerable to opportunistic defections and would quickly unravel. Rules that enjoy the appropriate level of support describe what Gaus calls "the optimal eligible set." Identifying this optimal eligible set should make it possible to transcend ideological obstacles.

Gaus's proposal is attractive, but it is not clear that it is wholly original. In many ways it resembles Rawls's suggestion that modern, pluralistic, democratic regimes are supported by an "overlapping consensus" of reasonable comprehensive views. Like Gaus, Rawls asserted that theorists must work with existing political commitments in order to understand and advance political principles.[2] Whether the property focus that Gaus adds to his analysis is ultimately helpful will depend on whether it is supported by the kind of moral consensus that he takes to be the ground of political legitimacy. The game theoretic analysis may not add much one way or the other.

As the title of Michael Zuckert's "Judicial Liberalism and Capitalism: Justice Field Reconsidered" suggests, he is interested in rehabilitating Stephen Field, Justice of the US Supreme Court from 1863 to 1897. Specifically, he wants to defend Field against the charge that he developed a line of constitutional interpretation with the express purpose of advancing his own capitalist ideology or, worse, the capitalist interests of his friends and associates. Zuckert's strategy is to review some of Field's cases and show how he was consistently guided by a particular (plausible) natural rights reading of the Constitution, one that leaned heavily on the Declaration of Independence and its commitment to inalienable rights. On this reading, Field becomes an advocate for a "classical liberal" interpretation of the Constitution, rather than a simple apologist for capitalism. One may still disagree with the interpretation, but now the debate is about competing visions of the Constitution, not whether the Justice used his position on the bench to invalidate legislation that he disliked.

In the collection's most engaging essay "Liberty after Lehman Brothers", Loren Lomasky brings some philosophical perspective to the debate between those who claim that the financial crisis of 2008 demonstrates a need for more government regulation of the financial sector, and those who claim that it demonstrates a need for even less regulation than currently exists. Lomasky, a self-avowed free market enthusiast, contends that market dynamics are best understood in terms of two countervailing metaphors. First, there is the Invisible Hand, which claims that people, left to their own devices (save for force and fraud) will interact in ways that will benefit them all. Second, the Prisoner's Dilemma describes situations in which the pursuit of individually rational options generates outcomes that, collectively, make everyone worse off.

Lomasky sees the financial crisis as a kind of prisoner's dilemma. In the financial sector, credit suddenly became scarce as financial institutions did not trust one another to be able to honour their obligations. This attitude was at once counterproductive and self-fulfilling: as each party called in its debts, everyone lost because one party's debt payments are another party's income, and as some institutions were pushed into bankruptcy the amount of money in the system contracted sharply. The cycle became ever more vicious. Lomasky claims that market economies have developed conventional rules for mitigating such eventualities. He cites personal bankruptcy rules, limited liability companies, and intellectual property rules as devices that serve to coordinate situations that could degenerate into generalized, sub-optimal outcomes. They also serve to allow market participants a high degree of personal choice, while attenuating the risks attendant to third parties.

However, Lomasky argues that the financial crisis of 2008 outstripped the capacities of existing rules as a result of three paradoxes: efficient markets, reduced risk and hard won knowledge. First, a generalized belief that the market is efficient led many to believe that market price reflected the true value of a commodity; thus people were unprepared when new financial instruments proved valueless. Second, the belief that bundling different kinds of debt attenuated the level of risk proved to be groundless because all the components turned out to be valueless. And third, the belief that the market had learned the lessons of previous crises led to overconfidence, as the new crisis was quite different from what came before.

Lomasky's analysis is compelling, and clearly comes out in favour of clearer and stronger rules for the banking sector. But as a free market supporter, he hedges with regard to just what kind of oversight would really be appropriate. This infuses a frustrating vagueness into his conclusion.

In "A Lockean Argument for Universal Access to Health Care", Daniel Hausman aspires to develop an argument for universal health care that even a classical liberal (i.e. a Lockean) could love. His goal is to improve on Norman Daniels' well known arguments in Just Health Care[3]. Daniels' argument, drawing on Rawlsian principles of justice, appeals to fairly strong notions of equality and equality of opportunity. Hausman argues that these commitments are at least controversial, and possibly problematic. Instead, he proposes that we understand basic health care to be a special kind of public good, one that meets the following conditions:

  1. The objective of the government action is crucial to independence and self-determination.
  2. People cannot secure for themselves the objective of the government action.
  3. Government action to secure the objective does not itself undermine the protection of life, property and freedom. (p.169)

On these terms, health care becomes more like national defense -- a cost that people can reasonably be asked to bear since all benefit from it. Hausman acknowledges that his view will support only a fairly basic level of health care for all, and it will not satisfy those who see health care as a matter of justice and fairness. Nevertheless, it may offer an opening to classical liberals who are tempted by the prospect of universal health care.

Richard Arneson's "Liberalism, Capitalism and 'Socialist' Principles'" is a critique of the socialist notion of ownership that G.A. Cohen developed in Why Not Socialism?[4]. Arneson tackles Cohen's guiding metaphor -- the "camping trip" model of communal ownership. Roughly, Cohen claims that when friends go on a camping trip, they fall easily into a model of common use -- items are used by all, when and as needed. This model is supposed to allow for a number of important social goods, including equality of opportunity, community and communal reciprocity. Arneson challenges each of Cohen's claims. He argues that a market economy can secure equality of opportunity by relying on devices such as taxation, redistribution and limits on inheritance. He then challenges the value of the principles that Cohen advocates. For example, he takes exception to the ideas of socialist community and communal reciprocity because they require individuals to effectively subsidize those who are underperforming simply because they are worse off (even if this is the result of their own action and intention). Arneson's analysis is compelling, but ultimately it is only effective against Cohen's somewhat idiosyncratic construal of socialist ownership. Theorists who do not think of social democracy as a kind of "camping trip" writ large will not be discomfited.

The articles by Michael Munger and N. Scott Arnold should come with an advisory to readers: "for committed libertarian audiences only." In "Euvoluntary or Not, Exchange is Just" Munger replays the Wilt Chamberlain example famously developed by Robert Nozick in Anarchy, State and Utopia. The point of Nozick's example was to show that, starting from any preferred initial (just) distribution, free exchanges would eventually lead to a quite different (and hence, by definition, unjust) final distribution. Munger introduces the term "euvoluntary" to capture the idea that a specific exchange is fully free, voluntary, uncoerced, fully reasoned, etc. However, there is a substantial critical literature surrounding Nozick's work, including the excellent critique developed by Barbara Fried[5]. She argues that Nozick's example relies on a misstatement and misunderstanding of the relationship between the individual (and the individual's endowment) and the social context of productive activity and exchange. An endowment is not a pre-social "given" that can be used to simply evaluate social outcomes. Instead endowments and outcomes both come freighted with social interpretations. (As noted above, Samuel Freeman makes much the same point in his contribution to this collection.) Munger fails to engage, or even acknowledge, this challenge.

In "Are Modern American Liberals Socialists or Social Democrats" Arnold's answer is "yes, both". And it is pretty clear that this is a bad thing. As he puts it, "One purpose of the essay is to explain how modern liberal ideas have strayed from those of the American Founding." (p.262) In the current American political climate, it is rhetorically damaging to be labeled a "socialist" or a "social democrat" -- consequently it would be bad news for modern liberals to discover that they are closet socialists of some kind. Arnold's claim is that since contemporary liberals are willing to countenance taxation and government expropriation ("eminent domain") in order to achieve various social goals (say, to support equality of opportunity) they have rejected the idea of "full liberal ownership" and so have become socialists: "effective control of the means of production has passed from private hands to the state." (p.282) But this is a bad argument -- an attempt to make a political point turn on a technical definition. And it turns out that, for Arnold, modern liberals are social democrats because they support the kinds of social institutions (universal healthcare, social welfare, employment support, etc.) advocated by social democrats in Scandinavia and other parts of Europe. "Guilt by association" also does not make for a good argument.

"Rule Consequentialism Makes Sense After All" by Tyler Cowen is an outlier. He argues against the traditional view that holds that rule consequentialism is ultimately incoherent and must reduce to act consequentialism in one form or another. The argument focuses on the context of the scenarios in which the slide form rule to act is supposed to take place -- the specific features of individual situations may pre-empt the need to consider individualized consequences. The argument will be of interest to moral theorists but it is not immediately clear why it is included in this volume -- perhaps because political policies and principles take the form of general rules?

[1] It is also the Cambridge University Press book version of Social Philosophy and Policy Volume 28, Issue 2, May 2011

[2] See John Rawls Political Liberalism (New York: Columbia University Press, 1993) esp. Introduction and Lectures 3, 4 and 7

[3] Norman Daniels Just Health Care (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1985)

[4] G.A. Cohen Why Not Socialism? (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2010)

[5] Barbara Fried "Wilt Chamberlain Revisited: Nozick's "Justice in Transfer" and the Problem of Market-Based Distribution" (Philosophy and Public Affairs Vol. 124 No.3 1995 pp.226-245.)