Liberalism and Distributive Justice

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Samuel Freeman, Liberalism and Distributive Justice, Oxford University Press, 2018, 355pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190699260.

Reviewed by Lisa Herzog, Technical University of Munich


This is a collection of essays most of which have been published before, between 2001 and 2018. They all deal with John Rawls' political philosophy, defending it against various criticisms and what Freeman takes to be misinterpretations. The essays are of admirable clarity, arguing for their positions in meticulous detail. For those interested in a comprehensive overview of Freeman's understanding of Rawlsian justice, the collection is likely to be an extremely valuable resource, not least for teaching.

Part 1, "Liberalism, Libertarianism, and Economic Justice" consists of two essays that distinguish Rawlsian liberalism from two other positions: libertarianism and classical liberalism. The difference between "classical" and "high" liberalism, discussed in the first chapter, turns mostly on the role given to private property rights and free markets, and the association with utilitarianism of the former, which the latter rejects. Freeman also discusses the practical implications of these theoretical distinctions, for example with regard to nondiscrimination rules (40-3). Libertarianism, for Freeman, is "not a liberal view", as the title of the second chapter holds, because it does not have a notion of public power that is exercised impartially for the common good, but instead derives the authority of government from a "network of private contracts" (63). Moreover, libertarians reject the inalienability of certain basic rights (77-80). These essays offer important distinctions that help to clarify current political and philosophical debates; once one has understood Freeman's arguments, the distinctions are likely to stick in one's mind.

Part II, "Distributive Justice and the Difference Principle", provides a detailed reconstruction of Rawls' understanding of the Difference Principle and explains why he took Property-Owning Democracy, rather than Welfare-State Capitalism, to be the best strategy for implementing it (130-2, more detailed in chap. 4). Chapter 3 is largely expository; for example, it includes a discussion of the different economic systems that Rawls considered (115-7, see also chap. 4). A central point for Freeman is that the difference principle is not "prioritarian" in the sense that any improvement, however small, of the position of the worst-off-members of society would justify higher inequality. Rather, it is the overall distributive pattern that matters (117-26). This also means that just societies do not have a duty to aim at unlimited economic growth, but can also opt for a "stationary state" (126, 128). In a "friendly amendment" (161) of Rawls's theory, Freeman also argues that certain rights of economic agency should be understood as inalienable, not least in order to protect the social bases of self-respect of the worst-off members of society (159-163). Unfortunately, neither Rawls nor Freeman discuss what happens when societies might have to go into negative growth, for example for ecological reasons -- given the realities of climate change, this would have been an interesting extension of Rawls's theory.

This part also contains the previously unpublished essay, "Private Law and Rawls's Principles of Justice". In it, Freeman argues that Rawls' principles of justice are applicable to private law regimes as well, not just to public law, and that the laws of property and contract, particularly, can and should be governed by Rawls's principles. This implies, for example, that the "caveat emptor" rule for contracts is problematic (181). However, the difference principle is hardly applicable to the laws of tort, because it deals with economic justice, which is simply a different area (184-191).

In Part III, "Liberal Institutions and Distributive Justice", Freeman argues for the importance of institutions for the Rawlsian approach to distributive justice. The focus on the "basic structure" is based on the Kantian idea of individuals as free and equal. In order to maintain a plurality of values, justice needs to be embedded in the institutional framework, so that individuals have the freedom to pursue various conceptions of the good, through liberties such as freedom of occupation and freedom of association (e.g. 248).

This approach also implies that Freeman, with Rawls, rejects the idea of global distributive justice: on the global scale, he argues, we do not have the same kind of framework of shared institutions as on a national level. Here, one may raise some empirical doubts -- haven't we long entered an era in which the kind of cooperation within shared institutions that Freeman takes to be a precondition of justice crosses national borders? For one thing, the mutual recognition of property rights by different countries is a precondition for global trade as we know it (see e.g. Wenar 2015). Does that not count as a sufficient shared institutional framework that creates a relationship, say, with the workers who produce the Coltan for my smartphone or who sew my clothes? To quote Freeman:

To have a claim upon the institutional benefits for a particular form of cooperation, and to be subject to its particular institutional burdens, requires membership and participation in that particular scheme of cooperation and doing one's fair share in making contributions. (216)

Couldn't something like this be said about global value chains as well?

Freeman acknowledges that there can be specific duties of justice that stem from trade relations or other forms of cooperation (215), but denies that this amounts to something like global distributive justice. However, given the intensity of international cooperation, both in the economic realm and in other social spheres, one wonders: at what point do these various forms of institutionally based cooperation add up to something that is of similar quality as the cooperation within one country? But one can grant Freeman's point that this question is different from questions of distributive justice within one country, and that different principles might be needed for each (e.g. 217). Moreover, leaving behind his ideal-theory approach, one might also ask what duties former colonizing powers might have towards former colonies, a topic never mentioned by Freeman.

Freeman also defends the Rawlsian approach against the charges raised by Amartya Sen that it is a form of "ideal theory" that is of little relevance for the fight against injustice in the here and now. He points out that "ideal theory" has in fact had a powerful impact on real history: the Lockean ideal of a social contract between independent property owners has shaped the American Declaration of Independence (258). The Rawlsian principles of justice can be applied to real-life questions, offering yardsticks for judging current issues, e.g. by applying the principle of equality of opportunity to issues of healthcare and access to education (265). In the end, Freeman contends, Sen's position is not as different from Rawls's as the former made it appear (286).

In the final chapter, Freeman defends Rawlsian constructivism against G.A. Cohen's charge that principles of justice should be independent of facts. He relies on three arguments: the necessity of formulating principles of justice that are compatible with human capacities (300-2), the importance of providing principles of justice that have a "practical" and "social" role as "public basis for justification" (303), and the affirmation of the pursuit of the human good, including the sense of justice (307-11).

Reading these essays alongside each other offers an opportunity to reflect on their coherence, i.e. on the relation between the various dimensions of Rawls' oeuvre that Freeman covers. The different parts, e.g. the rejection of classical liberalism with its connection to utilitarianism (chap. 1) and the rejection of welfare state capitalism (e.g. 146-7), or the idea of democratic and economic reciprocity (chaps. 4 and 7) and the ideal of a society of free and equal persons (e.g. 47-50) support each other; together they form an impressive edifice of ideas.

But it is also an opportunity to see what this way of theorizing, which has been so influential in Anglophone political philosophy, does not cover. While Freeman argues that Rawls' theory can and should be used for judging injustices in the here and now (chap. 8), there is nothing about political action, either by politicians or by citizens. For example, ideas about civic virtue or the co-responsibility for maintaining the institutional structures in which Rawlsian justice can be realized remain implicit at best. There is also very little on the cultural preconditions of Rawlsian liberalism, other than that citizens must respect each other as free and equal. And there is hardly anything on the more concrete steps it would take to rebuild the structures of our economic systems, domestically and globally, away from a ruthless and unscrupulous capitalism towards the property-owning democracy that Freeman envisages. Fortunately, younger scholars have started to work on many of these issues, trying to bridge the gap between the Rawlsian ideals and today's political realities.

Finally, the volume has one large blind spot. It creates the impression that the discussion about liberalism and distributive justice is exclusively a debate between men. If I am not mistaken, there are only four female names in the list of references. This would not be an issue if women had not written about issues of social justice, or if there were no reason to think that female perspectives had something distinctive to add to this debate. Both points can be questioned, though. On the first: some of the most prominent names that spring to mind are Susan Okin, Carole Pateman, or Elisabeth Anderson, and so many more could be listed. On the second: arguably, a society whose members respect each other as free and equal has to pay particular attention to gender justice. Freeman occasionally mentions the role of the family or the position of women (e.g. 108, 112, 123, 211). But so much more could be said -- for example about single parenthood as a cause of poverty, about the wage gap, about biases in hiring processes that undermine equality of opportunity, etc. Freeman might reply that his position takes all these things into account, and I do not doubt that this is true in the sense that in an ideally just society, there would be no gender injustice (in contrast to libertarian positions that do not conceive of discrimination along the lines of gender or race as injustice, see 81). But even on that ideal level, there are, for example, questions about what it means that all citizens should have access to "meaningful work in free association with others" (163) while there are also many forms of care work, traditionally done by women, that may make it more difficult for some than for others to have access to such work.

In sum, this volume provides a comprehensive overview of many of the debates that have occupied Anglophone political philosophy in the Rawlsian era. For those who are interested in an authoritative statement of Freeman's reading of Rawls, it is a must-read.


Wenar, Leif, Blood Oil: Tyrants, Violence, and the Rules that Run the World. Oxford: Oxford University Press 2015.