Liberalism and Prostitution

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Peter de Marneffe, Liberalism and Prostitution, Oxford UP, 2010, 193pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195383249.

Reviewed by Ekow N. Yankah, Cardozo School of Law



Peter de Marneffe’s Liberalism and Prostitution is a carefully written book exploring liberalism and its application to a pressing problem of criminal law.

De Marneffe’s exploration of liberalism, its limits and application, is of course not uncontroversial but it is systematic and challenging. His inspection of liberal conventions is detailed but avoids overly technical philosophical language. Because de Marneffe challenges liberal theory, his book is of interest beyond the borders of criminal law and should be read by anyone interested in political theory generally and liberal theory in particular.

This in no way diminishes the importance of the task at hand. This is, as de Marneffe reminds us, (10) no abstract exercise. Prostitution is a widespread industry, which imposes a life of fear, violence, and death on tens of thousands of vulnerable people, many young and overwhelmingly women. Addressing ways liberals can tackle this problem is an important and commendable philosophical endeavor.

The central question of de Marneffe’s book is whether one committed to liberalism can support legal regulation of prostitution. Put another way, does being a liberal commit one to the view that a person has an unrestricted right to be a sex worker? If a person has a right to engage in sex work, then current laws prohibiting prostitution certainly fail but so too do more moderate laws which would treat prostitution differently from other types of work. De Marneffe’s goal is to show that liberals can support various forms of government restrictions and regulations of prostitution.

Making this claim is harder than first appears, forcing de Marneffe to run the gauntlet of liberal orthodoxies. He begins by staking out territory against the most powerful of liberal tenets, the right of an individual to be free of paternalistic interference by the state. He first surveys the ways prostitution harms those working as prostitutes (13-17, 22-28). Those harms are deep and pervasive. Prostitutes typically suffer economically, physically and emotionally from prostitution. They rarely find economic success and experience deep and lasting psychological harm that retards their ability to form healthy lasting intimate relationships. (De Marneffe persuasively dispatches the idea that prostitution is harmful because it is illegal and thus stigmatized.) Against the idea that the government should act to reduce these grave harms is the intuitive idea underlying the commitment to anti-paternalism, that no one has the right to interfere with harms that people inflict on themselves.

With some preliminaries out of the way, de Marneffe builds a case for the paternalistic justification for some prostitution laws. He begins by challenging the most intuitive liberal objection: prohibiting prostitution limits the autonomous choices of competent adults over their sexual lives and bodies (33). Despite the fact that sex workers view prostitution as work, the core of prostitution involves, at least in part, sex and sexual autonomy. To the extent that sexual autonomy, including relating to one’s sexual powers as potentially commercial activity, is a critical part of a person’s autonomy, government regulation is particularly worrisome. Furthermore, criminal prohibition can make prostitutes’ lives worse by foreclosing a needed job and isolating them from police protection. For these reasons de Marneffe argues that absolute prohibition, which makes sex workers worse off, cannot be paternalistically justified (35-36).

Having concluded that prohibition laws cannot be paternalistically justified, de Marneffe compares other regulatory regimes to full decriminalization. De Marneffe surveys the difficulties with an abolitionist model, which criminalizes the purchase but not the sale of sexual services (typically criminalizing the men who purchase sex but not the prostitutes themselves) and regulatory models, which permit the exchange of sex for money while imposing various age, health and zoning regulations on sex work. After reviewing the difficulties of both models and the tragic dangers attendant upon decriminalizing prostitution — human trafficking, underage initiation into prostitution, widespread drug abuse and others — de Marneffe shows a modesty and thoughtfulness too often missing from debates on this emotional subject. Rather than putting forward a particular model, along with highly speculative claims predicting its superiority and success at reducing the tragedies of prostitution, he admits uncertainty both in our current knowledge and predictive ability. Nonetheless, his core claim remains that some model of paternalistic restriction and regulation can be justified even by liberal lights (44).

The philosophical project squarely in view, de Marneffe shows his precision, perhaps overly much. Take his first claim: de Marneffe argues that a paternalistic justification for restricting prostitution does not depend on a traditionally moralistic view that prostitution is wrong (45-46). He does so to avoid simplistic charges of governmental moralization and to avoid defending what some find to be inexplicable moral qualities of sex that make it ineligible for commercialization. Rather, he writes, the paternalistic view can be supported simply by noting that prostitution commonly harms sex workers and that laws restricting it reduce this harm.

The problem is that on many plausible theories, both common and philosophical, prostitution harms you in just the ways that de Marneffe says make prostitution wrong. An Aristotelian view — admittedly not a natural home for a liberal — holds that the moral wrongness of an action consists in the way it detracts from the development of the human virtues and, in turn, the way those virtues contribute to and constitute a life of excellence. Thus the fact that prostitution takes away from the ability to form lasting, intimate relationships is one of the reasons that it is morally wrong. If a virtue-centered view seems too distant from liberalism, one can point to no less a liberal than Mill. Mill famously thought that prostitution could not be criminalized but not because he did not think it was wrong. Despite Mill’s classically hedonistic utilitarianism, Mill believed that there were higher and lower pleasures. To the extent that overindulging in lower pleasures deadened one’s abilities to enjoy higher pleasures, these base pleasures represented a sort of moral harm. This is just the sort of harm de Marneffe highlights among the long term harms of sex work. (Even Kant reasoned that violating self-regarding moral duties was wrong because it made you unable to fulfill your moral duties to others and made you the object of scorn and contempt.)

The point is that on a range of philosophical and common intuitions, it is hard to maintain a sharp distinction between the contentions that paternalistic motivations are based on prostitution being bad for prostitutes rather than a moral notion that prostitution is wrong. Slender distinctions between an act being experienced as degrading as opposed to it being morally degrading (which would be an illegitimate ground for government regulations) cannot hold up. The worry is that de Marneffe avoids the claim that his paternalistic regulation is moralistic by employing an overly cramped notion of ‘moralistic’. This is in part an academic quibble about the term ‘moralistic’ but, more importantly, it is a claim that de Marneffe cannot avoid arguments about the legitimacy of moralistic regulation by avoiding the term (49-53, 55-58).

Terminological struggle aside, one cannot accuse de Marneffe of avoiding the heart of the question. Whatever its form, de Marneffe faces the question of paternalism directly. He challenges the view that it is illegitimate for the government to protect us from causing injury to ourselves. De Marneffe argues that

it is the government’s business to make us better off than we would be without government, and so to protect our interests and promote our welfare in ways that that are consistent with fairness and respect for our rights … When there is good reason for someone to prefer her situation with a law that limits her liberty in some way, and this reason has greater weight than anyone’s reasons to want this law not to be in place, including her own, then this reason can justify the government adopting this law (65-66).

De Marneffe combines this with an objective view of a person’s interests to justify paternalistic prostitution restrictions. De Marneffe further complicates the picture by adopting an anti-paternalist principle as a liberty protecting side-constraint. Roughly, that side constraint holds that if a policy limits an important liberty of a normal adult against her will, it cannot be justified on paternalistic grounds.

De Marneffe sets about defining each tenet with care. He begins with a persuasive description of what constitutes an important liberty, finding sexual liberty to be one. For de Marneffe, this means that a policy of absolute prohibition of prostitution violates his side constraint and cannot be paternalistically justified. Other forms of regulation, however, which merely reduce without foreclosing the sexual liberty expressed in prostitution, can be justified.

There are some fair debates to be had on the particulars of de Marneffe’s conclusions about important liberties, some normative, some empirical. But de Marneffe wisely chooses to move to the most important issue for his task — the balance between paternalistic laws and autonomy. Consistent with his rejection of strict anti-paternalism, de Marneffe denies that paternalistic justifications are especially disrespectful or undermining of autonomy. Instead, respect for autonomy requires only that the government secure liberties that are necessary for us to exercise adequate control over our lives and to deliberate well about the good and the right, liberties that symbolize full political equality (72). Procedural issues aside, people only have a complaint against a policy if the reasons they have against the policy outweigh the reasons anyone has to prefer a world with the policy (73). Put plainly, there is no general priority of liberty.

This, of course, is where the action is and de Marneffe deserves credit for meeting it head on. It would be too much to expect a neat resolution of this deep philosophical question. De Marneffe does a more than credible job explaining why he is not persuaded by a view that elevates autonomy to a place of unique priority. Further, because de Marneffe includes the reasoning about one’s life among his important liberties, he builds an attractive model. But for the many who hold the stronger view that part of autonomy consists in being able to ascribe our actions to ourselves, the lack of deeper engagement may be unsatisfactory. On this stronger view the reasons for liberty to be granted primacy of place are deeply tied to a view of moral agency and, indeed, identity itself.

After defining paternalism, de Marneffe tackles a series of antipaternalist positions both general (Mill) and specific to prostitution. There are points of interest here as well, including de Marneffe’s strategy of grounding permissible paternalism on the protection of minors, his arguments that restricting rather than prohibiting prostitution leaves sufficient room for Mill’s prized individuality, and his discussion of Rawlsian and Scanlonian contractualism. Still, the heart of the debate remains, I believe, his earlier rejection of anti-paternalism and liberty as primary.

Rejecting a liberty-based principle of anti-paternalism, de Marneffe attempts to demonstrate that laws restricting prostitution do not violate individual rights. In keeping with his views on paternalism and on important liberties, de Marneffe denies that there is a clear answer to whether one has a basic right to buy and sell sexual services and, more importantly, if this hypothetical right could ever be violated. For de Marneffe, the question again becomes whether there are sufficient reasons to restrict the liberty to buy and sell sex (111).

De Marneffe holds, against the most ardent supporters of criminal prohibition, that prostitution laws can violate the rights of sexual autonomy of some women. Though de Marneffe believes rights can be overcome if there are sufficiently important reasons, the weighty reasons for wanting control over one’s sexuality make a complete prohibition a rights’ violation (119). Abolitionist and regulatory models, however, which reduce rather than prohibit the opportunity to sell sexual services, de Marneffe proposes, do not violate the rights of sex workers. This is because the reduced opportunity to engage in prostitution is outweighed by the harms that are avoided by these policies. De Marneffe applies the same sorts of analysis to the rights of the clients of sex workers.

De Marneffe’s last substantive chapter tackles the related subjects of government neutrality between conceptions of the good and perfectionism. These facets of liberalism are important because certain versions maintain that even a policy that merely discourages prostitution violates norms of political morality. De Marneffe attacks the perpetually slippery problem of defining neutrality by surrounding it, giving a list of the type of reasons meant to be excluded by arguments for political neutrality (134). He then defends paternalism by arguing that a plausible view of neutrality cannot be interpreted to exclude all paternalistic policies or, in light of the number of important liberals who believe that some paternalism is permissable, strict neutrality is not essential to liberalism (137).

Ultimately, de Marneffe argues that no unique principle of neutrality can capture the various ideas bound up in the claim that the government must be neutral as to conceptions of the good. Thus, a “postneutrality principle” permitting some paternalistic laws, including those restricting prostitution, while preventing the invasion of important liberties best captures the moral intuition behind the principle of neutrality. Here, as always, the reader may be left with demands unsatisfied. I was particularly curious about relying on one’s potential future preferences to rebut the charge of illegitimately promoting a conception of the good. Defenses grounded in future preferences are difficult as they employ a hypothetical future you as against the actual you, especially given that there is no future you — after all, current choices in large part determine future preferences. On the whole, however, de Marneffe, as elsewhere in the book, is astute in his survey of arguments and proposes plausible counterarguments.

One global question one might pose to de Marneffe would be about the motivation of the entire project. Given that de Marneffe is focused on America (and to a lesser extent, Western post-industrialist societies) where the bulk of jurisdictions prohibit prostitution, one wonders why he dedicates his energy to convincing liberals that they can accept some regulation of prostitution rather than to convincing non-liberals and other legal moralists they can accept a move away from absolute prohibition.1 This strikes me as especially curious since my sense is that most liberals would willingly accept regulation of prostitution on liberal grounds of preventing harms to others (even if not on the deeper philosophical ground de Marneffe so elegantly pursues).

On the whole, de Marneffe has written a thorough and sharp book challenging some tenets of liberalism and their application to prostitution laws. His style is to move carefully through arguments and the reader often finds arguments anticipated and engaged. De Marneffe book carefully explores the intersection of liberalism, paternalism and prostitution laws and is important for anyone interested in this area of criminal law theory. Moreover, because de Marneffe explores the contours of liberalism, the book should be of interest far beyond the specifics of criminal law and prostitution.

1 Full disclosure: this reviewer has recently explored why illustrating that non-liberals can support decriminalization of prostitution is critical to the reform of prostitution laws.