Liberalism, Neutrality, and the Gendered Division of Labor

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Gina Schouten, Liberalism, Neutrality, and the Gendered Division of Labor, Oxford University Press, 2019, 256pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198813071.

Reviewed by Christie Hartley, Georgia State University


Despite the implementation of laws and policies that aim to address gender discrimination in education and employment and women's increased participation in the labor market, the gendered division of labor in paid and unpaid work persists. Women, as well as other caregivers, are disadvantaged as a result. Carefully crafted policy initiatives could rectify the stalled gender revolution, but, in the U.S. and in many other liberal democracies, the necessary policies are not adopted. In these states, people have different views of the good life and of justice, and they disagree about what, if anything, should be done to address the gendered division of labor. In her book, Gina Schouten offers a sophisticated analysis of some previous attempts to explain the problem with the gendered division of labor and of why these attempts are inadequate.

Then she offers her own, original diagnosis of the problem and justification for why the gendered division of labor must be addressed. She makes her project all the more challenging because she adopts the Rawlsian framework of political liberalism to make her argument. In this framework, the principle of liberal legitimacy restricts the reasons that can be offered for the justification of gender egalitarian social policy to the shared reasons of persons as free and equal citizens. She ambitiously argues that, given some circumstances, political liberalism demands the implementation of policies such as family leave initiatives, work time regulations, and substitute dependent care provisions.

Schouten's book is a must read for anyone who works in political philosophy, especially anyone interested in gender justice or anyone interested in the demands and limits of what can be done in the name of liberal legitimacy given reasonable pluralism. It is, truly, a great book. Of course, great books are controversial. This one will be, too. I note one of my main concerns below.

Schouten builds her argument over seven chapters, with the first three providing essential stage setting. Chapter 1 provides an overview of recent empirical evidence of the gendered division of labor, of the harms it causes to women, men, and children, and of the kinds of policies needed to create a gender egalitarian society.

Chapter 2 explains the basic tenets of political liberalism and why these tenets seem to preclude the enactment of laws and policies, championed by many feminists, aimed at dismantling the gendered division of labor. In short, a fundamental commitment of political liberals is that (certain) laws and policies must be reasonably justifiable to reasonable persons as free and equal citizens. However, political liberals also recognize that reasonable persons reasonably disagree about the good life and, to some extent, justice. Given these considerations, liberal legitimacy demands that persons restrict the justifications they offer for relevant laws and policies to the shared values and interests of persons as citizens. Shared values "include those that derive from the liberal political project of finding fair terms of social cooperation for a liberal democratic society in which free and equal citizens make divergent and irreconcilable judgments about matters of personal and political value," and shared interests "are those implied by our common status as citizens engaged in a cooperative scheme" (66).

Since reasons for law and policy must be based on the shared values or interests of persons as citizens, political liberals endorse a kind of justificatory neutrality with regard to views of the good life. However, insofar as feminist arguments for egalitarian social policy depend on values and interests that are not so shared but part of their particular worldviews, they cannot be used to justify such policy. Furthermore, Schouten argues that some strategies for justifying such policies that respect the shared reasons requirement are nonstarters. For example: 1) suggesting that reasonable persons must accept gender egalitarian worldviews is in tension with political liberalism's goal of showing that a liberal democratic society can be just and stable even given deep, reasonable disagreements among persons; 2) suggesting that gender socialization and the high cost of resistance to gender norms undermine voluntary choice would make most persons' endorsement of their view of the good non-voluntary and, thereby, threaten democratic authority; and 3) the claim that the gendered division of labor somehow undermines persons' basic liberties is implausible, given widely shared views of basic liberties.

Although the prospects of justifying gender egalitarian social policy aimed at dismantling the gendered division of labor may seem bleak, feminists sympathetic to political liberalism have made arguments that they claim satisfy the neutrality constraint. Chapter 3 offers an assessment of the dominant strategy used by feminists, which Schouten dubs the unjust distributions strategy or mal-distribution strategy. The central idea of this strategy is this: "the gendered division of labor constitutes or causes unjust distributions of goods" (93). So, shared reasons for addressing the gendered division of labor are available, and structural policy solutions seem to be the appropriate remedy.

However, Schouten contends this strategy is problematic and misdiagnoses the problem with the gendered division of labor. Most importantly, she argues that the fundamental problem with the gendered division of labor is not a problem of distribution at all. Rather, it has to do with the gender norms and institutions which provide "the social backdrop against which individuals make decisions about what paid and caregiving labor commitments to undertake" (112). We do not learn the precise nature of the problem on her view and why it is morally objectionable until later. What is important here is that, according to the mal-distribution strategy, the problem with the gendered division of labor is simply an unjust distribution of goods (e.g., in income and wealth, leisure time, positive health outcomes, etc.). Unjust distributions can be addressed by compensation or by different distributive schemes, including schemes with comprehensive gender egalitarian policies. But, this strategy gives us no reason to prefer one solution to the other. So, this strategy gives us no reason to prefer the solution that dismantles the gender norms and institutions that create the gendered division of labor over, say, a compensation strategy.

In Chapters 4 and 5, Schouten develops important claims about political legitimacy and citizenship in the context of addressing additional challenges for her view. In Chapter 4, she maintains that gender egalitarian social policies that incentivize or burden persons' choices regarding labor market participation and family life are compatible with some ways of understanding the primary subject of justice as the arrangement of society's main social institutions or, in Rawlsian terms, the basic structure. She reaches this conclusion against the backdrop of a sizable literature suggesting otherwise. For political liberals, she claims, it is through the principle of liberal legitimacy that the basic structure is determined for particular conditions: "It includes only those aspects of citizens' lives that they would agree to order politically on mutually defensible grounds and all those aspects of citizens' lives that they would insist be ordered on mutually defensible grounds" (131). Given this view, there is no fundamental commitment within political liberalism that poses a barrier to policies that incentivize or burden choices regarding work in the labor market or the family. Whether such policies are justified depends on the interests of citizens and the conditions of a particular society.

Chapter 5 outlines the interests of persons as citizens, which is important for Schouten's main argument, and addresses the argument I have developed with Lori Watson concerning whether political liberalism can and must address the social norms that create and sustain the gendered division of labor.[1] On our view, the problem with the gendered division of labor is this: it rests on gender norms that structure institutions and practices and that influence persons' choices in such a way that it systematically creates and maintains a gender hierarchy that is antithetical to the interests of persons as free and equal citizens. We claim that given the interests of persons as citizens and the justificatory requirements of the criterion of reciprocity[2] (from which the principle of liberal legitimacy follows), political liberalism demands that the gendered division of labor be addressed. Schouten, however, argues that some harms of the gendered division of labor are not due to hierarchy, and that policy aimed at addressing gender hierarchy would exacerbate the non-hierarchal harms. I return to these claims below.

Schouten's main argument can now be constructed, the essential components of which are in chapters 5 to 7. Her strategy is to start with political liberalism's conception of the fundamental interests of citizens and argue that, given certain conditions, citizens would demand gender egalitarian social policies to dismantle the gendered division of labor in order to protect their interests (149). Following Rawls, she understands citizenship as a normative and political conception of the person for the "liberal project of finding fair terms of social cooperation for a pluralistic society" (144). Citizens have the two moral powers: the capacity for a sense of justice and the capacity to form, revise, and pursue a conception of the good. They "are also characterized as having a higher-order interest in protecting their capacities as citizens" (144). Persons' interests as citizens are their shared interests as such. Schouten distinguishes the conception of persons as citizens from "background personhood," which is "the identity of persons as fully fleshed-out individuals with comprehensive conceptions of the good and various social affiliations" (143).

The conception of citizenship "provides a workable basis on which to develop a politically liberal theory of justice, because it gives substance to political liberalism's fundamental normative principle, the criterion of reciprocity" (145) which requires that persons offer others terms for cooperation that are reasonable for them to accept as free and equal citizens.[3] Given the interests of citizens, some terms of cooperation are unacceptable because they "threaten citizenship" (145). Other terms are either necessary to secure citizens' interests or permissible ways to secure them given the conditions.

Schouten next introduces a distinction between political autonomy and comprehensive autonomy. Political autonomy "concerns the sort of independence necessary to exercise the moral powers of citizenship" (182). Comprehensive autonomy "involves actually critically reflecting on and evaluating our ends and the values we espouse" (182). Comprehensive autonomy is not a shared value among persons as free and equal citizens, and so the value of comprehensive autonomy cannot justify terms of cooperation for persons as free and equal citizens. However, she argues that protecting a person's capacity to form, revise and pursue a conception of the good requires protecting the capacity for comprehensive autonomy. Moreover, protecting the capacity for comprehensive autonomy requires that role models of comprehensively autonomous persons are sufficiently available in society. An important implication of this is that "If broad enactment of comprehensively autonomous lifestyles does not obtain as a matter of course, then a citizenship interest favors subsidizing those lifestyles" (184).

Schouten, though, thinks that in a just, politically liberal society, there will be a "critical mass" of persons who value comprehensive autonomy and have comprehensively autonomous lives. So, comprehensive autonomy is effectively role modeled. Nonetheless, a "critical mass" of persons who value comprehensive autonomy will also value "the genuinely available option to enact gender-egalitarian lifestyles" (198). Indeed, Schouten argues that "the preference for more affordable access to gender egalitarianism is widespread" (200). A problem is that gender egalitarian lifestyles are excessively costly and "reasonably perceived" as so. The high cost has the effect of deterring those with a strong preference for the lifestyle from living in accordance with that way of life. The high costs are a "formidable systemic obstacle" to the lifestyle (201), and so the lifestyle is not a "genuinely available option." Schouten does not think these considerations alone are enough to justify gender egalitarian social policy.

But, there are other considerations that build on these. First, Schouten argues that, for a person who values a gender egalitarian lifestyle, "because the constraining costs of gender egalitarianism are due to a socially embedded assumption associating sex with work roles, they are an affront to her as a comprehensively autonomous person" (203). Yet, for political liberals, the value of comprehensive autonomy cannot justify interventions that address affronts to comprehensive autonomy. Only shared interests justify such interventions. Schouten proposes the following:

because comprehensive autonomy is politically valuable in protecting a fundamental moral power of citizenship, citizens wishing to enact it have a reasonable complaint of unfairness against an institutional arrangement that makes it excessively costly due to an institutionalized assumption that is inimical to it. (204)

This is Schouten's complete case for gender egalitarian social policies, but she says that more can be said. The high costs of gender egalitarian lifestyles, which, again, pose a serious systemic obstacle to a way of life, risk "large-scale discontent" and undermining stability for the right reasons.

With many of Schouten's claims, I am in complete agreement. Indeed, Watson and I use the same general strategy to argue that political liberalism demands the implementation of gender egalitarian social policy. That is, we too think that, given the fundamental commitments of political liberalism and persons' interests as citizens, gender egalitarian social policies such as family leave initiatives, work time regulations, and substitute dependent care provisions, must be adopted.

My main concern with Schouten's argument is that it is based on a diagnosis of the problem with the gendered division of labor that seems too far removed from the reasons she says we have to care about it. These reasons, with which I agree, suggest a different diagnosis of the problem and a different justification for gender egalitarian social policies.

Consider why Schouten says we should care about the gendered division of labor together with some of the conditions that Iris Young claims constitute the oppression of persons as members of social groups. First, Schouten flags the "oft cited-effects" of the fact that women continue to spend more time doing household work and caregiving for dependents than men, which include gender inequality in earnings and wage rates for women as well as slow career progression and forgoing career opportunities. Next, she notes that, when different sex couples in cooperative partnerships conform to gendered social norms for work, the "compliance enables the continued devaluation of caregiving, because it amounts to an acceptance that caregiving is private work which collectively, society has no interest in supporting," and, she says, this "helps to sustain an economic system that subjects low-income women and women outside the labor market to disproportionate material precarity, because they are associated with work we hardly recognize as such" (36).

These concerns exemplify Young's understanding of exploitation, which "occurs through a steady process of the transfer of the results of the labor of one social group to the benefit of another."[4] Women and other caretakers perform caring labor without pay or perform such work in under-valued, gendered, and often racialized care jobs. In both cases, the benefits of their labor flow to the advantage of others. Also important here is the group stigmatization[5] that women face as caregivers when they participate in the labor market. Viewed as distracted, unreliable, and uncommitted when compared with men, they receive lower ratings on performance evaluations, are offered lower wages, and are passed over for jobs and promotions.

Furthermore, Schouten says we should care about the gendered division of labor because it especially disadvantages single parents and their children, as employment in the labor market is not structured in recognition of the fact that participants are also caregivers. She stresses that insofar as the labor market is structured in accordance with a breadwinner/homemaker model, this is bad for couples who do not want to specialize but, again, "it is far worse for families that do not align with the traditional, heteronormative paradigm that this presumption reflects" (37). These concerns, I think, have to do with a kind of marginalization faced by women and other caregivers in society. While Young defines those marginalized as those "the system of labor cannot or will not use,"[6] they can also be understood as those who are systematically disadvantaged or burdened or face systematic barriers when they try to combine participation in the spheres of life central to citizenship (the labor market, political sphere, civil society, or the family).

The gendered division of labor is problematic, then, because it results in the exploitation, stigmatization, and marginalization of women and other caregivers. In other words, we should care about the gendered division of labor because it maintains and perpetuates a gender hierarchy that it is incompatible with the interests of persons as free and equal citizens. I think the reasons that Schouten identifies for why we should care about it are, straightforwardly, evidence of this. So, I find her argument unsatisfying because her diagnosis of the problem and her justification for gender egalitarian policies are, again, just too far removed from these reasons. In my view, the reasons for caring about the gendered division of labor should be front and center for political liberals and guide them in revisiting and revising the account of the fundamental interests of persons as citizens for the sake of a better and more complete account of citizenship interests. Only from a more complete account of the needs of persons as citizens can the terms of cooperation needed in a politically legitimate state be determined.

Of course, Schouten thinks that some harms of the gendered division of labor have to do with gender specialization, independent of gender hierarchy. These include: 1) harms that have to do with not being able to combine a commitment to paid work and a commitment to unpaid caregiving, given the structure of the labor market and the lack of policy and dependent care options for caregivers and 2) harms that result from "the terms of specialization" such as persons being pressured to assume a social role that "might not best suit their interests and temperament" (161). Both of these harms can be traced to gender norms about work most appropriate for men and women given their natures. In my view, such norms, as they mark out spheres or social roles for persons as members of social groups and, so, constrain persons' freedom, are always about (in)equality and not mere difference; they serve to create, justify, and perpetuate material and status-based inequalities, although I cannot argue for that here.

Despite my concerns, Schouten's book makes fantastic advancements in the analysis of the gendered division of labor and our understanding of the limits and demands of political liberalism. It will surely shape future debates about both.

[1] See, e.g., our Equal Citizenship and Public Reason: A Feminist Political Liberalism (New York: Oxford University Press, 2018).

[2] See John Rawls's statement of the criterion of reciprocity in "The Idea of Public Reason Revisited," John Rawls: Collected Papers, edited by Samuel Freeman (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1999) (hereinafter IPRR), 573-615, 578.

[3] IPRR, 578.

[4] Iris Marion Young, Justice and the Politics of Difference (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1990), 49.

[5] Young considers cultural imperialism a face of oppression, but Elizabeth Anderson helpfully untangles Young's notion into two distinct phenomena: cultural imposition and group stigmatization, the latter of which is of concern to me. Anderson, The Imperative of Integration (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2010), 15.

[6] Young, Justice and the Politics of Difference, 53.