Libertarian Anarchy: Against the State

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Gerard Casey, Libertarian Anarchy: Against the State, Continuum, 2012, 208pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441144676.

Reviewed by Julie L. Rose, Brown University


In this accessible book, Gerard Casey provides an introduction to the theory of libertarian anarchy (also known as anarcho-capitalism or market anarchism). The book is part of Continuum's Think Now series, which is aimed at a general audience, and, as such, is written in a casual style, without jargon and with some humor. The book's ideal audience is primarily non-specialists who are sympathetic to libertarianism.

The libertarian theory most prominent in contemporary political philosophy is that of Robert Nozick, which combines a commitment to inviolable individual rights with the acceptance of a minimal state to protect those rights. Libertarian anarchists endorse the central libertarian commitment to individual liberty and property rights -- the right to do as you wish with your person and property provided you do not infringe on the like rights of others -- but depart from more mainstream libertarians (so-called minarchists) in rejecting even the minimal state as a legitimate means to protect those rights.

The anarchist strain of libertarianism is most closely associated with Murray Rothbard's theory of anarcho-capitalism, and Casey, having previously written an intellectual biography of Rothbard, hews closely to Rothbard's theory.[1] Indeed, though Casey rejects Rothbard's anarcho-capitalist label -- both because of the "statist" connotations of capitalism and because libertarianism permits consensual non-capitalist economic arrangements -- he still traces his preferred moniker's lineage to Rothbard, whom Casey notes was once described as an "Austro-libertarian anarchist" (161). Fusing Rothbard's views with those of a range of other anti-statist libertarians, Casey provides brief surveys of the historical origins of the state and law and theories of libertarianism, anarchism, and state legitimacy.

Beyond offering these overviews, however, the book's "principal concern" -- and its claim of greatest philosophical interest -- is its argument that the state is not necessary to "meet the need for law, order and justice" (31, 148). In advancing this argument, the book contributes to a lively debate within libertarian political philosophy between anarchists and minarchists about the role of the state in protecting individual rights. The question at issue in this dispute is whether libertarian justice requires, permits, or prohibits the existence of a (minimal) state.[2]

Casey initially appears to leave few doubts about where he stands on this question. The book's opening sentences suggest that Casey views no state as compatible with libertarian justice: "States are criminal organizations. All states, not just the obviously totalitarian or repressive ones." Casey continues, "I intend this statement to be understood literally and not as some form of rhetorical exaggeration" (1).

Chapter 2 develops this claim. Here Casey defines the state as "a monopoly of allegedly legitimate force over the inhabitants of a determinate territory financed by a compulsory levy imposed on those inhabitants" (11). He then advances the familiar assertion that the state is no morally different from a band of robbers. The next two chapters develop the commitments underlying this claim.

Chapter 3 introduces the libertarian view of individual rights as specified by the non-aggression principle: "no one may initiate or threaten to initiate the use of coercive physical violence against the person or property of another" (38). Respecting this principle exhausts the requirements of libertarian justice. "Whatever is done, provided it involves no aggression or threat of aggression, is ipso facto just" (58).

In Chapter 4, Casey defines anarchy as the prohibition of any form of non-voluntary domination, whether by the state or anyone else (61). Casey's libertarian anarchism, then, departs from minarchist libertarianism, in that minarchists are willing to accept a non-voluntarily imposed state that enforces the non-aggression principle. The resulting sole requirement of Casey's account of libertarian justice is that one must not be subjected to violence or the threat of violence, unless one has consented to such subjection. This chapter also introduces Casey's account of property rights, a view that combines the natural rights approach of Locke with the conventionalism of Hume.

Taking the next two chapters in reverse order, I will consider Casey's rejection of the state before turning to his argument on behalf of an alternative to the state. In Chapter 6 Casey examines whether it is possible to justify the state's existence. He rejects what he takes to be the three most prominent and plausible accounts of state legitimacy: democratic representation, implicit consent, and a Burkean social contract.

Though Casey's rhetoric sometimes suggests any state is illegitimate -- as in his opening claim that all states are criminal organizations -- the view he advances actually commits him to conceding that libertarian anarchism does not, in principle, prohibit the existence of a state. At most, the view allows the claim that all current and past states are illegitimate. The view cannot go further to prohibit any state, for if a state protects and does not infringe upon individual rights and is explicitly consented to by those over whom it wields force, it is perfectly compatible with the tenets of libertarian anarchy. Such a state would not violate the non-aggression principle, nor would it be a form of non-voluntary domination.

At the close of the book, Casey does indeed concede that "a legitimate state governing by consent is not actually impossible" (139). He is quick to deflate this concession by claiming that such a consensual state is "unlikely" for feasibility reasons, but he nonetheless accepts that a coercive state is not in principle prohibited by libertarian anarchism.

To return, then, to the disputed question of whether libertarianism prohibits, permits, or requires the existence of a (minimal) state, Casey's view at most allows that a state is permitted but not required by libertarian principles. The remaining question, then, is whether a state is required to realize libertarian justice.

The standard libertarian anarchist position, classically espoused by Rothbard, is to argue that a state is not required to protect individual property rights because that function could instead be performed by competing, non-monopolistic protection agencies. The usual response to this standard argument, most prominently offered by Nozick inAnarchy, State, and Utopia, is that such competing protection agencies would inevitably merge into a single super-agency effectively equivalent to a minimal state.

Casey, however, does not take this standard route, and indeed does not even mention it as a possible position (despite, without presenting Rothbard's protection agency view, rebutting Nozick's argument against it). Instead, drawing on F.A. Hayek's distinction between law and legislation (socially emergent versus intentionally imposed rules), Casey argues that a state is not required because "customary law" can serve the core function claimed by the state, the maintenance of social order.

Chapter 5 advances this argument. Here Casey offers a speculative history of the origins of law and argues that in the absence of a coercive state, both historically and presently, a system of customary law spontaneously emerges. Such law is "the delimitation of customarily permissible and impermissible actions, adhered to by members of the community because they accept them as right and natural, and enforced by social disapproval and, ultimately, social exclusion" (93). Beyond gesturing at a reliance on customary law for most of human history, Casey offers three particular examples of anarchic societies governed by customary law: medieval Ireland, contemporary Eskimo society, and contemporary Somalia.

There is a significant problem for the libertarian in relying on customary law to secure social order: there is no guarantee that customary law will realize libertarian justice. Whatever customary law emerges in a society may not protect individuals' rights in their persons and property. The customary laws may not protect some individuals from the force and domination of others, especially historically vulnerable groups of people, such as women. The customary laws may also not protect individuals from liberty-infringing "morality" restrictions, as, for instance, long-imposed regulations on consensual sexual behavior.

Casey concedes both of these failures of customary law, with specific reference to both women and morality restrictions. He attempts to respond to these difficulties by arguing, first, that these failures of customary law are not "a necessary feature" of customary law, and, second, that though customary law would not be "perfect," the customary laws that emerged under anarchism would nonetheless be "better than they are now" (74, 75).

But these replies are far from satisfying. The choice that libertarians face is not between either the modern state or customary law. Libertarians have another option, indeed the option that most endorse and that is the subject of current debate: the minimal state, whether voluntarily or non-voluntarily imposed. Casey offers no engagement with existing arguments on behalf of a non-voluntary minimal state, and his only argument against the consensual minimal state is that it would not be feasible.

If the only reasons that Casey offers libertarians to favor customary law over the minimal state depend on feasibility, and by extension how each is likely to be realized in practice, then his replies to the possibility that customary law would violate individual rights fall short. Granting that liberty violations may not strictly be "a necessary feature" of customary law, and granting even that they may be "better" than those of the modern state, it is nonetheless still likely that customary law would infringe on and fail to protect individual rights. Once on the grounds of feasibility and practical realization, Casey must provide some reason to believe that customary law would protect individual rights better than the minimal state. Libertarian Anarchy, however, offers no argument to this end, nor even a consideration of how customary law fares next to the libertarian alternative, the minimal state.

Despite these argumentative shortcomings, Libertarian Anarchy does have another stated aim, one that it better realizes. That is, the book aims to challenge the "imaginative tyranny of the present," the "myth" that the modern state is necessary and legitimate (13). As Casey states, "My aim in this book is to make the historical contingency, functional lack of necessity and illegitimacy of the state both conceivable and imaginable" (14).

If this aim is interpreted as simply to show that one cannot take the legitimacy and necessity of the state as givens to which one need not devote any critical consideration, then, by this metric, the book serves its end. Perhaps to those for whom these ideas are novel, the book would effectively serve as a provocation to question the inevitability and legitimacy of the modern state. For political philosophers, however, merely clearing this bar is not enough. Though most do, on consideration, believe that states are functionally necessary and that they can be legitimate, these views are not simply accepted as part of a "myth." They are centrally disputed questions of political philosophy. To these important questions, Libertarian Anarchy does not substantively respond.

[1] Gerard Casey, Murray Rothbard (Continuum, 2010).

[2] For a useful recent volume on this debate, see Roderick T. Long and Tibor R. Machan (eds.), Anarchism/Minarchism: Is a Government Part of a Free Country? (Ashgate, 2008).