Libertarianism without Inequality

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Otsuka, Michael, Libertarianism without Inequality, Oxford, 2003, 158 pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 0199243956.

Reviewed by Ian Carter , University of Pavia


In this important contribution to rights theory, the deontology of punishment, and the problem of political obligation, Michael Otsuka argues against the belief, prevalent on both the left and the right of the political spectrum, that the fundamental principles of libertarianism conflict with the ideal of economic equality. This allows him to defend “libertarianism without inequality” – a radical and provocative normative construction that is both more egalitarian and more libertarian than mainstream (left-of-centre) liberal egalitarianism.

Both radical extremes are claimed by Otsuka to derive from Locke, the basis for equality lying in the “Lockean proviso” according to which any private appropriation of resources must leave “enough and as good” for others, and the basis for libertarianism lying in Locke’s concept of self-ownership, his assertion of the right to enforce one’s own rights, and his idea of political society as a voluntary association. What holds the seven chapters together is indeed their relevance to Lockean themes in moral and political philosophy, rather than their direct relevance to the overall vision of “libertarianism without inequality”. The book places Otsuka squarely in the camp that has recently come to be known as “left-libertarianism”, but it contains more besides.

Otsuka’s style is pithy, engaging, and crystal-clear. His theses are bold, imaginative, and defended with the utmost philosophical rigour. Some less philosophically minded political theorists will no doubt accuse him of failing to address the problems of the real world. If you dislike discussions of distributive justice centred on the problem of carving up a desert island among a group of childless shipwrecked adults, then this book is not for you. But if, like me, you approve of such abstract discussions as a way of isolating the moral intuitions at work in more complex, real-life situations, then you are also likely to appreciate Otsuka’s deft and incisive argumentation. In my view, the book represents one of the best recent contributions to normative political theory.

There is another sense in which Otsuka’s work is deliberately detached from the real world: despite a good part of it being concerned with the justification of punishment, most of it is pitched at the level of ideal theory. This, together with the radical nature of its normative theses, gives the book a rather utopian flavour. Although Otsuka’s left-libertarian conception of the just society is very different from our own society, he is interested above all in defending the coherence and appeal of that just society, and not in advising us about how best to get there if we start from where we are now.

The first part of the book sets out the two basic tenets of Otsuka’s brand of left-libertarianism. Simplifying somewhat, Otsuka affirms both a principle of self-ownership, which gives each person the right to control her own body and a right to any income she can gain from its use (through labour), and an egalitarian version of the Lockean proviso, which states that one may gain property over previously unowned worldly resources as long as one does not leave any other people at a disadvantage in terms of “opportunity for welfare”. (Otsuka follows Richard Arneson in preferring a welfarist metric of advantage to a resourcist one. This means that how well off a person is depends on the self-interested preferences she would have in an ideal context of deliberation.) As Otsuka convincingly argues in the first chapter, these two premises can be reconciled by denying the thesis, advanced by Robert Nozick and confirmed by his leftist critic G. A. Cohen, that a right to one’s talents and labour necessarily entails a similar right to the products of those talents and labour. The latter right would be entailed only in cases where the materials of one’s labour are parts of one’s own body (e.g. one’s own hair, which, if one is a practised weaver, one might turn into a blanket). The same right would also be entailed, of course, where the relevant materials are worldly resources over which one already has property rights. These last property rights, however, are not themselves derived from the right of self-ownership. Except in rare cases like that of hair-weaving, then, there must be some initial right to worldly resources that is prior to one’s engaging in the labour that, when mixed with those worldly resources, can legitimately generate income. This initial right to worldly resources can be limited by Otsuka’s egalitarian proviso without implying any curtailment of the right of self-ownership.

One thing that any robust form of self-ownership does seem to exclude is forcing those with superior natural endowments (measured in terms of income-generating talents) to work in order to finance compensation for the poorly endowed (most dramatically, the disabled). In a second chapter, Otsuka presents and defends the novel proposal that welfare payments to the disabled can nevertheless be financed without encroaching on the rights of self-owners, by instead taxing convicted criminals. Criminals have forfeited their initial rights by voluntarily violating other people’s rights. It is not unjust that they be made to pay for their crimes in monetary terms, and it is not unjust for the state to use the income generated to help the disabled.

The second part of the book, comprising chapters 3 and 4, discusses the right to punish and to defend oneself against aggressors. Despite their relevance for Lockean political theory, which posits a natural right of individuals to enforce the laws of nature, the contribution of these chapters to Otsuka’s version of left-libertarianism is limited. But the discussions they contain are valuable in their own right as contributions to the deontology of punishment and self defence. Building on Warren Quinn’s derivation of the right to punish, Otsuka argues for a right to punish an aggressor subsequent to her violating one’s rights, even if this is not necessary as a means of deterring that same aggressor from repeating the violation, but only as a means of deterring others. Given his uncompromisingly deontological outlook, however, Otsuka further maintains that guilt on the aggressor’s part is a necessary condition for the justification not only of punishment ex post, but even of preventive action in self-defence. If, for example, my life is being threatened by an “innocent aggressor”, whose drink has been spiked with a violence-inducing drug, then I have no right of self-defence. This, of course, seems counterintuitive. But Otsuka also carefully shows that this case cannot be distinguished in any morally relevant respect from the widely condemned case in which someone kills an innocent bystander in order to defend his life against some natural threat.

The third part of the book explores the notion of political society as a voluntary association. Otsuka argues that political society is legitimate if and only if it is a voluntary association, not in the hypothetical sense normally implied by contemporary contractualists (eg. Rawls), but in the literal sense implied by Locke. Like Locke, Otsuka states that political authority depends on actual consent on the part of each and every one of the governed. Also like Locke, he asserts that it is sufficient that this consent be given only tacitly, through one’s continuing, on reaching the age of majority, to live within the political society in which one has grown up. However, he also argues that one of the main weaknesses in Locke’s account of tacit consent – the difficulty and costliness for a poor person of opting out of her political society – is overcome by left-libertarianism which, through its egalitarian proviso, gives each individual substantial resources with which to make a real choice about the costs and benefits of allegiance. And he further argues, unlike Locke, that individuals who do not consent to live in political society should be allowed to secede, taking with them a plot of land and forming, in the extreme case, a “monity” (a territorially-based society of one person). Otsuka’s utopia is similar to Nozick’s, involving a plurality of small political societies (e.g. villages, towns and cities) within any one set of national boundaries. Individuals are free to join any society that will have them, and their consent, on joining, is genuinely voluntary. This plurality of political societies will be overseen by a (global?) “inter-political governing body”, which will ensure respect for all individuals’ self-ownership rights and the property rights derived from the egalitarian proviso – rights which remain natural and therefore binding on all political societies (and monities).

Otsuka’s voluntarist theory of political obligation has two further implications, which he explores in the final two chapters of his book. The first, which will be highly unpalatable to mainstream liberal egalitarians, is that we can have no objection to individuals freely agreeing to set up highly illiberal political societies – say, societies with strong restrictions on freedom of movement or freedom of speech, or even slave societies. This is a consequence of Otsuka’s view that, if you are really a self-owner, there can be no objection to your contracting away your freedom. The second consequence is that living individuals have no obligation to obey laws passed by people who are now dead and about whose authority the living have never been consulted (for Americans, such laws include the constitution). Otsuka points out, however, that this last problem is automatically overcome in the left-libertarian just society, in which individuals tacitly consent, on coming of age, to all the existing laws of the land. The second implication therefore turns out to be something of a red herring from the left-libertarian point of view, and is really only a problem for liberal democrats who claim that the legitimacy of laws derives from their being passed by legislators elected by a majority of the people.

I shall confine my discussion of Otsuka’s arguments to three critical points that directly concern his own brand of left-libertarianism.

My first point concerns Otsuka’s reconciliation of self-ownership with equality. Does this reconciliation really amount to a demonstration of the compatibility of these two ideals (as Otsuka claims), or rather, and less ambitiously, to a compromise between them (i.e. a weakening of one of them exactly in order to avoid what would otherwise turn out to be an incompatibility)? My reason for raising this doubt lies not in any weakness in Otsuka’s argument as set out in the above summary of his book, but in the fact that, in order to preserve equality over generations, he further claims that the right of bequest must be denied, and that the right of parents to make gifts to their offspring must be severely curtailed. It is not clear to me why the denial of these rights does not entail a curtailment of the right of self-ownership as defined by Otsuka, which includes “a very stringent right” to all that one can gain “through unregulated and untaxed voluntary exchanges with other individuals” (p. 15). Can bequests and gifts be outlawed without outlawing some such “voluntary exchanges”? Otsuka does not claim that they can. More simply, his answer is that the initial right to worldly resources, which (as we have seen) is derived independently of the right of self-ownership, does not include the right to engage in voluntary transfers that violate the egalitarian proviso (p. 39). But then it seems to me that the question of how best to interpret the right of self-ownership (as defined by Otsuka) is being answered in accordance with, and as a consequence of, its subordination to the egalitarian proviso (with which it would otherwise conflict). The right of self-ownership is here being weakened in order to accommodate the egalitarian proviso.

This is not to deny that other arguments might be found against the right of bequest. Hillel Steiner, another prominent left-libertarian, has argued that such a right is simply inconsistent with a correct (i.e., a “will-based”) account of rights. Notably, however, Steiner does not outlaw intergenerational gifts between the living, and the reason for this, I take it, is exactly that he would not like to admit the existence of a conflict between the Lockean proviso and the right of self-ownership.

My second point concerns Otsuka’s plan to make the unjust pay compensation to the disabled. The idea is ingenious, but we may have empirical reasons for doubting that the revenue from such a scheme would be very high. Firstly, as Otsuka implicitly admits, libertarians can at most allow the state to glean a surplus, after it has financed restitution for the victims of crimes. (I leave aside here libertarian arguments – like those of Randy Barnett – to the effect that one may never extract from criminals any more than is required for such restitution.) Secondly, if, as Otsuka himself suggests, we attempt to overcome this problem by punishing criminals very severely, we are likely to provoke a reduction in the crime rate. (Is it morally acceptable for the state to maximize its revenue by aiming for an “optimal” level of punishment, such that crime is not overly discouraged?) Thirdly, in our own society most convicts are poor. The point here is not that they cannot be made to pay (they can be forced to work), but that one of the benefits of left-libertarianism is supposed to be a drastic reduction in poverty, and hence, one would hope and expect, in crime. In our own poverty-ridden world, Otsuka’s scheme might be thought to be questionable because the voluntariness of crime (on the part of the deprived) is questionable. In Otsuka’s just world, however, where crime becomes more voluntary, the crime rate may for this very reason be lower.

My third point concerns Otsuka’s concepts of political society and “inter-political governing body”. Otsuka says that only the legitimacy of the former necessarily depends on actual consent. The latter is instead justified by the mere fact that in its absence “disorder and chaos” would ensue (p. 108). This, however, seems to imply a considerable weakening of what originally appeared to be an uncompromisingly voluntarist theory of political obligation. The inter-political governing body is, after all, entrusted with overseeing, if necessary by force (if not, how?), the application of Otsuka’s two left-libertarian principles of justice (self-ownership and the egalitarian proviso), and presumably all of the property rights that derive from them. Otsuka calls this a “bare minimum necessary” of non-voluntary political obligation (p. 109), but this bare minimum looks fairly substantial from the point of view of the orthodox libertarian. There are of course still important voluntarist elements in Otsuka’s proposal – in particular, his insistence on the possibility of illiberal societies existing within the jurisdiction of the inter-political governing body, and the fact that these societies may stake territorial claims consistently with the principles of justice. Nevertheless, he seems to be closer to Rawls than to Locke in his derivation of the right of governments to enforce the principles of justice themselves.

I have raised some criticisms here of some of Otsuka’s arguments, but that is the way with all provocative and engaging philosophical work, however well argued. His book will no doubt give rise to a great deal more discussion, and it surely deserves to have a major impact on current debates on justice and political obligation.