Liberty and the Pursuit of Knowledge: Charles Renouvier's Political Philosophy of Science

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Warren Schmaus, Liberty and the Pursuit of Knowledge: Charles Renouvier's Political Philosophy of Science, University of Pittsburgh Press, 2018, 154pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780822945352.

Reviewed by Jeremy Dunham, University of Durham


French philosophy in the nineteenth-century remains a hugely under-researched and rich area of the history of philosophy. Few book-length English language studies of it exist. A recently published anthology on nineteenth-century philosophy makes reference only to Bergson,[1] a philosopher who flourished only at the very tail end of this era. Nonetheless, slowly but surely a number of articles and translations are starting to appear. French philosophers, such as Maine de Biran (1766-1824), Félix Ravaisson (1813-1900), and Clarisse Coignet (1823-1918) are being studied again -- and it is clear that they have important and interesting philosophical things to say on a broad range of issues. Perhaps the most profound and exciting of all the nineteenth-century French philosophers (and certainly the most prolific) is Charles Bernard Renouvier (1815-1903).

William James certainly thought so, and in 1876 wrote to him that:

I am perfectly convinced . . . that you will take your place in the general History of Speculation as the classical and finished representative of the tendency which was begun by Hume, and to which writers before you had made only fragmentary contributions, whilst you have fused the whole matter into a solid, elegant & definitive system, perfectly consistent, and capable by reason of its moral vitality, of becoming popular, so far as that is permitted to philosophic systems . . . you may depend upon it that the name of Renouvier will be as familiar as that of Descartes to the Bachelors of Arts who leave these [Harvard's] walls.[2]

Of course, Renouvier did not find his place in the general history of speculation. In fact, most philosophers -- even historians of nineteenth-century philosophy -- have not heard of him at all. Most of those who have, know him as a footnote to William James's philosophy, or perhaps Durkheim's, rather than a thinker in his own right.[3] The publication of Warren Schmaus's short book on Renouvier as a political philosopher of science, however, might be the first step toward correcting this.

Schmaus's work is not by any means an overview of the full scope of Renouvier's philosophy or an intellectual biography. Renouvier published around twenty-five thousand pages of work, and even more exists in the archives, which makes any such overview a truly gargantuan task. Rather, Schmaus focuses on the relationship between Renouvier's political philosophy and his philosophy of science. Schmaus writes that the book's purpose is to 'rescue Renouvier's reputation and hopefully to encourage others to undertake further study of his philosophy' (xii). I think we can divide this purpose into two missions: (1) the "rescue" mission and (2) the "encouragement" mission. The encouragement mission is achieved by means of the attempt to present Renouvier's philosophy of science as an appealing form of politically structured conventionalism that is free from the charge of conservatism, sometimes levied at more famous but later conventionalists, like Poincaré. The rescue mission addresses the claim that he held conservative views in mathematics and evolutionary theory that prevented him from getting on board with developments in non-Euclidean geometry and Darwinian evolution. If Schmaus is to succeed in the encouragement mission, he needs to show that the conservative views do not follow from a conservative methodology.

Schmaus, during his encouragement mission, presents Renouvier as holding a pluralist view of the sciences according to which an individual science is formed and demarcated by means of a set of postulates agreed upon by a community of scientists. These are practical postulates in the Kantian sense, yet transferred into the theoretical domain. They are indemonstrable, but necessary for empirical research in the particular science to take place. They are what Schmaus calls, in order to move Renouvier into the recognisable history of philosophy of science, "conventions". A rather general but simple example of a convention that all scientists would need to hold on to would be the invariability of natural laws. It is not empirically demonstrable, but still a necessary postulate of scientific empirical inquiry. What makes this conventionalism a political philosophy of science is that the agreement upon such conventions is, according to Renouvier, a kind of social contract. Scientists make an agreement not to challenge certain postulates, concepts, and hypotheses and to restrict their researches within certain boundaries. They come to this agreement in moral and political ways that entail a process of mutual recognition amongst a community of inquirers.

Schmaus presents Renouvier's philosophy of science as in sharp opposition to Auguste Comte's. While Comte believed that science could be used to legitimate certain political orders, Renouvier believed the reverse was true. Science itself can only be legitimized on the basis of certain political structures. Furthermore, it is the political structure behind the agreement of a science's conventions that allows Schmaus to defend Renouvier from the charge of conservativism. Ultimately, Renouvier is a fallibilist and a staunch believer in free will. The epigraph of Schamus's book is an important quote from Renouvier that brings these two aspects of his thought together: "Properly speaking", he writes, "there is no certainty; there are only people who are certain".[4] For Renouvier, there is no magic bell that tolls once we hit on something certain. All we can do is weigh the evidence and make the (free) decision about whether or not we should believe something. Such beliefs are always revisable in light of future evidence. The same is true for the conventions. These hypotheses, concepts, or postulates are justified only insofar as they allow for the progress of science. If they fail to support this, then they should be adjusted or abandoned. Science works best when we recognize this and when individual scientists are able freely to challenge each other and to keep open discussion alive.

Despite this promising philosophy of science, Renouvier held some disappointing views on the developments of science in his day. However, in two chapters on mathematics and evolution, Schmaus does an excellent job of showing that Renouvier's views were nowhere near as indefensible as has been made out in the existing scholarly literature. In these chapters, Schmaus shows an excellent grasp of the relevant history of philosophy and anyone with an existing knowledge of Renouvier's philosophy will find these chapters fascinating. He provides excellent contextualization of Renouvier's arguments and assesses them given the state of knowledge at the time. Importantly, Schmaus shows convincingly that whatever Renouvier's views were, he accepted their provisional nature and at no point tried to block any avenues for future research in these domains. Schmaus's attempt to rescue Renouvier's reputation over these points, therefore, should be regarded as a resounding success.

Those readers who come to the book without prior knowledge of Renouvier's work will, however, no doubt be more interested in the presentation of Renouvier's own philosophy. In the chapters dedicated to this presentation, Schmaus does a good job of providing an appealing overview of it from the perspective of Renouvier's philosophy of science. This is a unique and excellent contribution to the scholarship. Nonetheless, this is done from a fairly high altitude. Schmaus's presentation of Renouvier's theories of freedom, scientific conventions, and his social contract theory are tantalizing, but I would have loved to have read more detail about these issues, as well as a more careful presentation of the philosophical arguments that Renouvier provides in defence of them. Similarly, Schmaus suggests in the introduction that a thorough investigation of Renouvier's model for a philosophy of science might reveal to us a way of thinking more promising than that of his immediate successors, such as James and Durkheim, and our contemporaries, like Philip Kitcher. Yet these tantalizing suggestions remain just that. Schamus says very little about the specifics of the problems with these other theories, or how exactly Renouvier's philosophy might be a better alternative to them.

I am very glad that this book exists. I hope it will be widely read. It does an excellent job of focusing in on one aspect of Renouvier's philosophy and shows that it should be taken very seriously. Beyond what is discussed in it, there is a lot more of Renouvier's work that deserves careful scholarly attention. I hope that this book will inspire more philosophers to look for it.

[1] Shand, John, ed. (2019) A Companion to Nineteenth Century Philosophy. Wiley-Blackwell.

[2] James, William. (1992-2004) The Correspondence of William James. Volume 4. I. K. Skrupskelis et al. (eds.). University of Virginia Press, pp. 541-542.

[3] On Renouvier’s influence on James, see Dunham, Jeremy (2015) "Idealism, Pragmatism, and the Will to Believe". British Journal for the History of Philosophy. 23(4): 756-778.

[4] Renouvier, Charles (1912). Essais de critique générale. Deuxième essai. Traité de psychologie d’après les principes du criticisme. Volume 1. Paris: Colin, p. 366.