Liberty, Desert, and the Market: A Philosophical Study

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Serena Olsaretti, Liberty, Desert, and the Market: A Philosophical Study, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 184pp, $70.00 (hardback), ISBN 0-521-83635-2.

Reviewed by Iwao Hirose, University College, Oxford


Since the collapse of socialist regime in the Eastern Europe, the market mechanism has been championed and promoted in many countries. Admittedly, the market mechanism has many attractive features. It offers an account of how producers and consumers reach an efficient (Pareto optimal) allocation through the local information and the system-wide prices. At the same time, it is widely conceived, in both theory and practice, that markets need to be regulated in order to eliminate various forms of "market failures". Some ambitious people, however, attempt to extend the advantages of market mechanism to the domain of justice. One way of doing so is to claim that income inequalities resulting from the free and voluntary transactions in markets do not give rise to a legitimate complaint about justice. Even if the market mechanism creates inequalities between people, such inequalities, it is claimed, should be seen as just. In Liberty, Desert, and the Market, Serena Olsaretti considers whether the claim along this line could survive the close examination in light of moral and political philosophy. She argues against two types of justification for market-created inequalities: the desert-based and entitlement-based justifications.

The desert-based justifications of the free market hold that income inequality generated by a free market is just because deserved. Olsaretti starts with identifying five modest conditions, which must be satisfied in order for the justifications to be successful: (1) desert must be neutral about whether or not the motives of agents are virtuous; (2) the demands of desert must not be wholly determined by the rules and purposes of institutions; (3) desert must be independent from other values that defines justice; (4) inequalities in desert do not reflect unfair opportunity; and (5) everyone must be treated equally relative to their desert. Then, she examines two versions of desert-based justifications of the free market. The first version, the compensatory desert argument, holds that inequalities in income can be deserved as compensatory payments for exceptionally costly or hazardous work. It holds that the principle of compensation is a principle of justice; that a distribution justified by the principle of compensation is just; and that the incentive payments people obtain in a free labour market are compensation for costs they incur. The other version, the contribution argument, according to which income inequalities created in the free market should be seen as the deserved rewards for people's productive contribution. This argument holds that the principle of contribution is a plausible interpretation of desert, that a distribution justified by the principle of contribution is just, and that the rewards people obtain in the free market adequately reflect the productive contribution they make. Olsaretti argues that the interpretation of desert in the two arguments is not really an independent and distinctive notion of desert, thus failing to meet condition (3). She further argues that both arguments do not meet conditions (4) and (5), given that the disposition of natural talent and the role of luck are substantive determinants of the differences in productivity. Thus, she rejects the two desert-based justifications of market-created inequalities.

Most thrilling, in my view, is her argument against the entitlement-based justification of the free market. According to libertarians such as Robert Nozick, a distributional inequality is just when and because it has been brought about as a result of the voluntary and free exchange of legitimately acquired resources between self-owning persons. Individuals have full ownership rights in themselves and external resources, and what justice requires is the voluntary and free consent of these individuals. Libertarians claim that a free market society is a society where nearly all interferences with people are voluntarily consented to, so there is nearly no limitation of people's freedom. Individuals have certain rights, and voluntariness is a necessary and sufficient condition for the legitimacy of nearly all interferences with people. Market is said to satisfy this voluntariness requirement. It appears clear that freedom and voluntariness play crucial role in the libertarian defence of the free market.

Then, Olsaretti reconstructs the libertarian argument using two important notions: the rights-defined freedom and the rights-defined voluntariness. According to the rights-defined freedom, an individual's freedom is curtailed only when he is prevented from doing what he has a right to do. This characterization of freedom is quite familiar from the work of Nozick and the recent literature on the individual rights and freedom in social choice theory. Olsaretti offers her own characterization of voluntariness, which is less familiar to us. "An action or a choice is non-voluntary, or forced, I suggest, if and only if it is done because there is no acceptable alternative to it, where the standard of acceptability is an objective one" (p. 119). Nozick seems to derive his right-definition of voluntariness from his rights-definition of freedom, and does not distinguish voluntariness and freedom in the way Olsaretti suggests. But, given the proper distinction between these two notions, she argues, Nozick's notion of voluntariness rests on a mistake. For example, consider the case of worker W and employer E, where W offers a poorly paid hazardous job to E who would be unemployed and eventually starve if he does not work for E. If we assume that the right-defined voluntariness presupposes the rights-definition of freedom (i.e. voluntariness is derived from freedom), then we must agree with the following step of reasoning.

  1. If E acts within his rights, he does not infringe W's rights;
  2. If W's rights are not infringed by E's actions, then E's affecting of W does not render unfree;
  3. If W is not rendered unfree, then W acts voluntarily; therefore,
  4. W does not act non-voluntarily if E, by limiting W's choice, has acted within his rights.

Olsaretti claims that (3) is false. This is because W has no alternative other than working for E! W does not voluntarily choose to work for E, even though he is not rendered unfree. The decision to take part of market transactions hardly counts as a voluntary choice. The upshot is that morally defined freedom does not guarantee voluntariness, and hence that freedom and voluntariness are quite distinct notions. Olsaretti's proposed notion of voluntariness now appears to be more plausible than Nozick's. She further contends that even if a rights-respecting free market were a realm in which people's freedom is not curtailed and transactions are not coercive, it does not follow that it would host only voluntary transactions. As the libertarian defense of the free market relies on an incorrect understanding of the relationship between freedom and voluntariness, it does not establish the claim that market-created inequality is just. It should be noted that Olsaretti picks out the internal incoherence in the libertarian defence of the free market by appealing to the notions of freedom and voluntariness, which libertarians heavily rely on but fail to distinguish properly. She does not appeal to any consideration external to libertarianism. This makes Olsaretti's criticism powerful and distinctive.

On Olsaretti's view, a person is not seen to do an act voluntarily unless she has some acceptable alternatives to it. This view is interesting, and may be applied to a different issue in moral philosophy. For example, many philosophers believe that "ought" implies "can". If a person just does what he ought to do, and if there is no possibility for her to do otherwise, the normative force of ought would be rather limited. This is because she cannot do anything other than what she ought to do, and she cannot fail to comply with what she ought to do. The ought-statement has the normative force, only when a person can choose what she ought to do out of other alternative acts. This means that "ought" implies "cannot" as well. Olsaretti's proposal of voluntariness may offer us a hint for our better understanding of the ought-statement in this way.

The proper distinction between freedom and voluntariness brings Olsaretti further. If libertarians take the voluntariness of choice to be a necessary condition for the legitimacy of interference with individuals (and believe that only voluntary choices are justice-preserving and responsibility-grounding), then they have reason to support not the free market, but the circumstances in which every one is provided with a range of acceptable options (e.g. a guaranteed minimum for all) and is thereby enabled to make voluntary choices. Thus, she reconstructs libertarianism in a radically different form, and this reconstruction is all done by the proper understanding of the notion of voluntariness. This claim is rather surprising and thought-provoking.

Olsaretti sets out this book with a modest motivation. She considers the highly ambitious claims that the market-created inequalities are just, and offers the careful and detailed analysis on the desert-based and entitlement-based justifications of the free market. Her criticisms against these justifications are powerful and original. Furthermore, she brilliantly shows the surprising result that libertarianism would justify not the free market but the empowerment of individuals' voluntary choices. This is, without doubt, a significant contribution to the theories of distributive justice in general and the libertarian theory in particular. The book is a required reading for anyone with an interest in moral philosophy, political theory and welfare economics.