Life: A Modern Invention

Placeholder book cover

Davide Tarizzo, Life: A Modern Invention, Mark William Epstein (tr.), University of Minnesota Press, 2017, 248pp., $27.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780816691623.

Reviewed by Charles T. Wolfe, Ghent University


Biological life taken as a philosophical object has been discussed in various traditions since the early twentieth century. Some of these traditions, like that which crystallized in the 1960s into the field we now know as ‘philosophy of biology’, are very much with us today. Others, like ‘biophilosophy’, ‘biological philosophy’ (Canguilhem 1947) or Lebensphilosophie (sometimes rendered ‘philosophy of life’), belong now to historically motivated research, although some hold-outs can insist that theirs is a minority current, an alternative and perhaps superior way of investigating biological phenomena. One typical faultline here is Darwinism. That is, defenders of a ‘philosophy of life’ typically distinguish themselves from the more ‘Darwinian’ and (in their view) more ‘reductionist’ approaches in mainstream philosophy of biology (despite the earlier pleas of Ernst Mayr). Tarizzo’s book belongs in this vein, but in fact, there is not one, monolithic form of ‘Continental philosophy of biology’.

In the work of thinkers such as Georges Canguilhem and Marjorie Grene (1969, 1974; it is difficult to call it a ‘tradition’), the concept of organism is crucial, inasmuch as it serves as a kind of biological analogue for the ‘self’ or ‘subjectivity’ (depending on which vocabulary one favors), and figures of organicism such as Jakob von Uexküll and Kurt Goldstein are very important. Tarizzo, however, is not interested in such projects, and speaks in passing and dismissively, of “those twentieth-century biologists who wanted to reintroduce the subject into biology at all costs,” naming Uexküll and Goldstein among others (99). He also, somewhat surprisingly, treats Canguilhem as a naïve, almost tautologous philosopher of normativity and health as mutually defined terms (178f.), of ‘normality’ as an empty determination of life, or a definition of life as that which is without determinations (178). Canguilhem also stands for the “infusion of subjectivity into life” (179), like Goldstein, and Tarizzo calls Canguilhem’s theory an “individualistic vitalism” (180), and Canguilhem himself an “aristocratic rebel” (184). But Canguilhem’s philosophy of life and concept of health (articulated around a dynamic normativity) are not so far removed from the vision Tarizzo attributes to Darwin: a kind of dynamic, non-essentialist, perhaps ‘relational’ metaphysics.

Tarizzo is not calling for a philosophy of organism, or a phenomenology of embodiment. Rather, he wants to engage with a less specifically biological, more metaphysical, articulation of Life and Modernity, in a manner strongly reminiscent of Giorgio Agamben. The latter’s influence is patent, including in Tarizzo’s repeated use of the totemic Agambenian phrase ‘bare life’ (more than twenty times, often followed by the German phrase, although it’s unclear what bloßes Leben adds to ‘bare life’).1 Tarizzo also puts himself under the patronage of Foucault, stating that his “attempt to decrypt the semantics of modern ‘life’” follows “in Foucault’s footsteps” (13). Additionally, his writing at times is strongly reminiscent of the tradition of philosophical anthropology:

One needs to understand in what manner this conjunction of . . . will and life, under the sign of human defectiveness also connotes the sensible and corporeal aspect of the human figure. If the longing hollows out a void in natural man that distorts his image and consistency, then his corporeal foundation must also bear the traces of the same ‘discomfort’. (73-74, with an explicit reference to Lebensphilosophie on 75)

But another reason Tarizzo’s inquiry into Life is different from other Continental philosophies of biology (or Life, or organism) is the presence of Darwin at the centre. Tarizzo is actively interested in Darwin and Darwinism. For a work that speaks the language of abysses, deficiency, lack, hollowness, human defectiveness and ‘bare life’, it is surprising to find an engagement with Darwin, who seems at first to be treated quite favorably (he is, Tarizzo asserts, “the most influential philosopher, and not only scientist, of the last two centuries” (95)). It is only in the third and shortest part of the book, “Us,” that we learn that Darwin is — in a way indeed more typical of Continental discussions, as noted above — the bad guy: Darwinism and Hitlerism really are connected (186-188, 194). This is the first book of philosophy I’ve read in a long time which actually quotes Mein Kampf.

The general project here is to articulate a ‘bridge’ between a science and a metaphysics of life, sometimes presented more specifically as a twofold metaphysics of labor and a metaphysics of life (although it ends up being more the former: ‘labor’ here seems to be chiefly represented by some commentary on Kant and Hegel, with accompanying reflections on human alienation). But ultimately, these “two great metaphysical options of modernity,” that is, labor and life, reveal a third and doubtless more fundamental property, which figures such as Darwin and Nietzsche play a key role in unveiling: a kind of emptiness, or lack of determination (a more metaphysical version of the absence of foundations which philosophical commentators on Darwin have pointed to at least since John Dewey). This emptiness also stems from the fact that life as a value is future-oriented: “Hegel and Darwin, display the reactionary and the progressive movements of modernity, respectively”; the social history of the ‘labor-force’ places the “truth of the present” in the past, whereas the “natural history of the life-force” places it in the future ((33, 49). Labor and life are the “two hands of the metaphysical clock of modernity” (33).

That we will hear a lot about ‘modernity’ in this narrative is indicated, at minimum, by the titles of the book’s three, unequally long chapters: ‘Modernity’, ‘Life’ and ‘Us’. Tarizzo’s short but dense work is thus several works in one: a post-Hegelian reflection on modernity and the will, and an original attempt at a Continental metaphysics of life à la mode d’Agamben, with significant attention paid to Darwin (a figure who is usually conspicuously absent from such theories, or primarily maligned when he is discussed). For reasons of interest and of competence, I will primarily focus on the latter aspect, although as we will see, Tarizzo’s claims about ‘life’ and ‘biology’ turn out to also be claims about ‘the will’, ‘autonomy’ and ‘modernity’: “That is why we, the moderns, live. Because modernity, the age of autonomy, is also the age of life. We are no longer, we live” (3). Autonomy is “the metaphysical threshold of modernity” (13), and in the end all these terms seem to define each other: “the ontology of modernity is the ontology of autonomy” (2); the “metaphysical world” we inhabit is “the world of autonomy,” and therein, “the horizons of life and will are merged” (94). Ultimately, "each time we speak of “life,” it is always us, the moderns, who are talking" (13; see also 23, 31, 48, 50, 77, 94, 104-105, 194, 218).

Tarizzo also suggests, in a kind of gradually building or unfolding leitmotif rather than a claim with evidence presented, that ‘life’ becomes a problem with modernity, when ancient forms of teleology and order fall apart:

The word life begins to acquire a new meaning. We are at the twilight of the ancient teleological vitalism, according to which each living organism obeys a final form of its own, preordained for all eternity. We are at the dawn of an altogether different vitalism, on whose horizon life will explode within living beings as a final force, blind and savage, that ceaselessly deforms and transforms its profile. (77)

The somewhat strange usage of the term ‘vitalism’ makes this statement a bit hard to grasp, but I believe Tarizzo is contrasting the eras of ‘before and after Darwin’, much as it used to be common to do so with ‘before and after Descartes’, or ‘before and after the Scientific Revolution’: in each case, the contrast is between a teleology-centred worldview and a more fragmented, chaotic, ‘modern’ worldview (here described as “blind and savage”). The “moment of modernity . . . is not so much a historical moment as a metaphysical moment,” when “the theological and pyramidal order of the cosmos, where everything was held together by the mind and will of a God, a principle, an ultimate foundation, collapses. Up to that moment one could still craft one’s life according to divine will” (104-105). In the new metaphysics Tarizzo sees as coming from Darwin, “life isn’t Form, it is Force” (151).

What Dennett and others have referred to as the ‘universal acid’ of Darwinism — how it acts as an agent of dissolution of forms of life as immutable entities, and by extension, of various, perhaps all forms of essentialism — is presented here as an idea first intimated by German Idealist thinkers; Tarizzo credits basically all of them (Kant, Fichte, Schelling and Hegel) in this respect. In his view, “purposiveness without a purpose” and “survival of the fittest” amount to “the same speculative move” (136). We are no longer in the world of Kant avec Sade, but rather, Kant avec Darwin. Whether it is Kant on the will or Darwin on life, the implications are the same (129-133). Similarly, what he calls ‘the god’ that Darwin “inserts into nature,” namely, Life, most resembles in his view “Schelling’s Grund, an unconscious and impersonal ground that exacts an infinite debt of life from the living, ceaselessly instigating them to perfect themselves” (151). The identification of the implications of Darwinism with some core metaphysical tenets of Schelling extends as far as Dawkins (“doesn’t the same force of the Self pulsate in Dawkins’s gene and in Schelling’s Geist?” (169)) and Dennett, for whom, in Tarizzo’s rendering, “life is freedom, life is subjectivity, and this life is that of a vital Self that does not amount to any personal Self, to any cognitive Self, i.e., to consciousness” (176). Dennett’s appearance is not all that surprising, given that he was jokingly equating himself with postmodern denials of the self back in the 1990s, if not earlier; however, ‘bare life’ is probably a bridge too far even for as open-minded a thinker as Dennett.

Now, if it were simply a matter of emphasizing the influence of Naturphilosophie on Darwin, we would be on familiar ground, and Tarizzo could perhaps be more generous to scholars who made that claim of influence at length, notably Robert Richards (Richards 2002). Similarly, his claims about there being a kind of residual teleology in Darwin are not exactly news (cf. Lennox 1993). Granted, he extends the claim of the relationship further into the posterity of Darwinism itself, and makes useful suggestions that go beyond the claims about Naturphilosophie and Darwin. For instance, Tarizzo’s way of positioning Kant, Fichte and especially Schelling in closer proximity to Darwin than is commonly thought sits well with some promising current research,2 although Tarizzo’s intentions, and ways of presenting these relations, are metaphysical rather than ‘scholarly’. But Tarizzo has a more provocative claim than just reiterating the importance of a ‘Romantic biology’ tradition for our understanding of Darwin and Darwinism. The prose is not always easy to follow at this point, but his claim seems to be two-pronged: on the one hand, Kant, Fichte, Schelling, Hegel turn out to be part of the same trend which culminates in Darwin, in which ‘will’ and ‘life’ are merged. A rather shopworn name for this which Tarizzo uses often is “modernity,” usually defined in a circular way with respect to these other terms, as I have noted already: “Life, which is the last name of modernity” (50). On the other hand, Darwin himself turns out to the agent of a kind of ultimate emptying-out (kenosis), a process in which life becomes the supreme value and thereby, marks the end of values.

From Schelling to Darwin and Dennett, humanity is being reconfigured as ‘open’, as ‘indeterminate’, ‘imperfect’, ‘incomplete’ (171f., 176); notice that unlike most discussions of natural selection and its implications, here it is not finches, nematodes or the speciation of the London Underground mosquito Culex pipiens f. molestus that is at issue, but humans. Natural selection at first sounds like it is being presented positively here:

natural selection comes off as a reiterated “yes” to life. It is the “yes” life says to itself, choosing itself, selecting itself, in order to be able to do so tomorrow as well. It is a “yes” that is not addressed to the “utility” of individual living beings, which is invisible to life as such, but to the vitality of their emerging characteristics, in which a pure will to life, a demand for life, a will to life of life itself, takes shape, (144)

But it turns out that this happens in a pernicious way: “What is life? The problem becomes pressing once things don’t add up” (104-105). Tarizzo does not engage with an alternate possibility, which was first seen clearly by Dewey, and reiterated subsequently by Richard Rorty (Rorty 1995): that Darwin does indeed have a destructive impact, but a positive one, in that he takes the first major step away from a Hegelian teleological view of history and humanity (Dennett’s ‘universal acid’ is a different but related way of giving Darwin philosophical credit).

In a somewhat familiar move, which has something ideological about it but is hard to categorize in straightforward terms, being equally conservative and classically Marxist (in a sense akin to, say, Lukács’ Destruction of Reason), Tarizzo traces a dark process which seems to culminate in Nietzsche and Darwin (and then Hitler), in which ‘will’ comes to mean ‘will to live’ (88), life becomes the ‘struggle for life’, and thus life/health become the ultimate value. “We have thus arrived at the threshold, at the entrance to the metaphysical world we inhabit, the world of autonomy, in which the horizons of life and will are merged. The two moons that shine over this nocturnal landscape, where the human has been lost, are Health and Salvation” (94); “life is kept alive by our will to health” (54). Tarizzo seems sarcastic about this inexhaustible ‘will to health’, which is barely living at all (62). And rarely, he gives hints that his ‘metaphysics of Life’ could be a social critique, as when he speaks dismissively of “bare natural life” and of people who sound a lot like the old category of ‘bourgeois’, “believing that at least in their leisure time they are free: free to live, in an eternal Sunday of life that will prove to be more ferocious than even Hegel had feared” (44). At first, I thought this was indeed a piece of Lebensphilosophie, in which statements such as these were to be taken as positive: “Life begins to distribute itself into fields in which its force, its heat, is concentrated. Life, now here, now there, seems to be set on fire” (139). But in fact, if it is Lebensphilosophie, it is one in which this has been turned into a warning, akin to the old reproaches addressed to Nietzsche: that a promotion of ‘Life’ as ultimate value will have terrifying consequences for our moral and social life, and for our understanding of humanity overall, in a kind of self-destruction of normativity — although Tarizzo never spells out how we should respond to this danger (but it also might explain his hostility to Canguilhem, however misplaced it might be).

That Tarizzo thinks Darwin and Darwinism lead to Hitlerism is clear enough: “Darwinism, i.e., the theory of natural selection, is racist and discriminatory, as facts have demonstrated many times and unfortunately continue to demonstrate” (194). Why this is the case is a bit trickier to make out from his book. Most basically, both raise life to the status of an ultimate value. But then, we (we moderns, we people of today, whoever the ‘we’ is) are just as bad! Indeed, “Worse still, we are the last racists, because we already embody the future, we embody human beings to come, we embody the eschatological Race that by definition and on principle cannot be followed by any other” (213). I’m not sure exactly what is meant here, but somehow, it must have to do with the gradual emptying-out of identity and foundations that Tarizzo describes as ‘modernity’. It’s not just that it’s wrong to treat human beings in biological terms: the situation is worse than that. Life as a value ends up somehow self-destructing. It would be petty and somehow tedious to reproach this book for not offering enough of a positive message (not as in self-help or spiritual improvement, but in the sense of content other than deflationary, demystifying or generally critical). Indeed, Tarizzo is frank enough to conclude without promising anything else: "Finding the right door to exit from modernity is an exigency that has been felt for a long time, from the time modernity irrupted among “us.” People have tried to open many doors, without this yet having allowed us to reach the result we yearned for" (218).

A review is rarely complete without some minor quibbles. This is not a work of history of philosophy or history of biology, although it helps itself to such materials and repeats claims that are sometimes a bit out date (scholars have shown for some time that the term ‘biology’ was in fact in use well before 1802, notably in German). But that doesn’t alter the core claims, which one can be persuaded by, or not. Indeed, Tarizzo states that such scholarly concerns would be misplaced here: “When reconstructing the genesis of modern life, it is best not to be blinded by dates” (64). On scholarly grounds, I shall just register that I found the discussion of Diderot quite odd; playing on Diderot’s word inquiétude and Locke’s word ‘uneasiness’, Tarizzo suggests that “not even with Diderot do we escape the anthropomorphic analogy between vitality and the human will. As a matter fact, the inquiétude automate he speaks of seems to be only and exclusively that of the naturalist confronted by the enigma of life” (102). But Diderot’s physicalist description of the ‘automatic restlessness’ of molecules has nothing to do with the cognitive state of ‘uneasiness’ that Locke discussed. It is also more than odd to describe Diderot as a ‘morphological’ thinker like Goethe (114). Diderot is a card-carrying Lucretian! — one who writes at length about the lack of perennity of forms, of species coming and going, and if anything, about the persistence, not of organic form but of what he calls ‘molecules’.

As for issues not concerning the content, the book is nicely produced and edited, aside from the occasional typo (96), editorial error (Maupertuis’s Système de la nature is not printed in Diderot’s Pensées sur l’interprétation de la nature, contrary to the reference at 233), or infelicities of language (ideas described as being “wacky” or not in nineteenth-century biology, 119). As a pet peeve, Life begins with a reference to the “classical age” (1); now, this term which Foucault popularized in French, l’âge classique, actually means the ‘early modern’ period (in English, the classical age is that of Homer and Pindar).

This book claims to offer a metaphysics of labor and life. It is more the latter. The metaphysics of life in modernity, or of modernity as a system in which life becomes a paramount value, will be appealing to some; stalwart Darwinians, philosophical naturalists and those not immediately inclined to a certain species of biopolitics will doubtless not be converted by this book.


Canguilhem, Georges. 1947. “Note sur la situation faite en France à la philosophie biologique.” Revue de Métaphysique et de Morale 52(3-4): 322-332. Reprinted in vol. 4 of Canguilhem’s Œuvres Complètes, ed. C. Limoges (307-320). Vrin, 2015.

Grene, Marjorie. 1969. Approaches to a Philosophical Biology. Basic Books.

Grene, Marjorie. 1974. The Understanding of Nature: Essays in Philosophy of Biology. Reidel.

Lennox, James. 1993. “Darwin was a Teleologist.” Biology and Philosophy 8(4): 409-421.

Richards, Robert. 2002. The Romantic Conception of Life: Science and Philosophy in the Age of Goethe. University of Chicago Press.

Rorty, Richard. 1995. “Dewey Between Hegel and Darwin.” In H.J. Saatkamp (ed.), Rorty and Pragmatism: The Philosopher Responds to his Critics. Vanderbilt University Press, 1-15.

1 The delightful epigraph of this book, taken from Walter Benjamin’s “Critique of Violence,” which warns against the sacralization of life, is also used by Agamben. At one point, Tarizzo clarifies his usage in relation to both Agamben and Roberto Esposito’s ‘biopolitical’ reflection on modernity and the camps (191): briefly, while Agamben and Esposito operate respectively with juridical and political frameworks, Tarizzo describes his framework as metaphysical.

2 Thus one can point to notions of evolution in the late Kant (in the Opus postumum) and in Schelling’s philosophy of nature, in the former case based on a principle of life treated as distinct from the principle of matter, and in the latter, as absolute activity, beyond any distinction between matter and life. Thanks to Bohang Chen for sharing his current work on this topic with me.