Life After Faith: The Case for Secular Humanism

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Philip Kitcher, Life After Faith: The Case for Secular Humanism, Yale University Press, 2014, 175pp., $25.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780300203431.

Reviewed by Alvin Plantinga, University of Notre Dame/Calvin College


"The central purpose of this book," according to the preface, "is to show how a thoroughly secular perspective can fulfill many of the important functions religion, at its best, has discharged" (p. xiii). Philip Kitcher concedes that this may take a while: "a fully rewarding secular world cannot be built in a day" (p. 2). Kitcher seems genuinely sympathetic to religious concerns, and genuinely concerned to understand them. He writes with sensitivity and insight. He has an attractive style and writes well (although it isn't always easy to tell precisely what he means to say).

Kitcher begins (chapter 1) by explaining why he rejects religion. Here he is more nuanced and less bombastic than the dreaded new atheists, who, as he suggests, overlook the central role religion plays in the lives of most of the world's population: "Yet the atheist movement today often seems blind to the apparently irreplaceable roles religion and religious community play in millions if not billion, of lives" (p. xiii). Nevertheless, he claims, religious beliefs, beliefs about "the transcendent" as he takes them to be, are "almost certainly false" (p. 105). I'll begin by outlining his suggestions as to how a secular outlook can serve the same functions and goals as religion; then I'll examine his arguments for atheism.

In chapter 2, Kitcher considers the connection between religion and ethics or morality: why is the idea of a tight link between religion and ethics so perennially popular? "The answer," he suggests, "lies in the difficulty of producing any persuasive rival account of ethics -- and of values generally -- that will not reduce ethical life to the expression of subjective attitudes" (p. 27).

His aim in this chapter, then, is to give a naturalistic vindication of values; an account of ethics that fits with secularism but doesn't reduce the ethical life to the expression of subjective attitudes. As he notes (p. 28) it is common to think of moral or ethical standards as independent of human desires and aspirations, having a sort of objectivity that fits well with their being divinely commanded. On Kitcher's account, of course, these standards don't originate in anything like a divine command, and Kitcher's account of ethics and morality doesn't give it that sort of objectivity. What status do ethical standards have, according to him? It's not easy to tell. As far as I could make out, Kitcher believes that ethical rules have simply evolved over the centuries as a means to the reduction of "functional conflict" (p. 53) and the promotion of harmony in a society. It's a good idea for us (as members of a society) to follow these rules, and to coerce the unwilling also to follow them, in order to introduce and maintain functional harmony in our society. On this prudential account, of course, there isn't any such thing as objective moral obligation, and there would be nothing wrong, morally speaking, in my flouting current ethical precepts (provided I could escape detection).

In chapter 3, Kitcher treats "refined religion", i.e., versions of religion in which all doctrinal statements are taken to be literally and strictly speaking false, but can be usefully read as metaphorical or allegorical ways to guide conduct: "At the core of religion, then, is not a body of doctrine, a collection of descriptions of the transcendent, but a commitment to values that are external to (independent of) the believer, and indeed to all human beings" (p. 64). Although he is sympathetic to refined religion, in the end Kitcher rejects it as not going far enough:

Secularists resist the thought that only the myths and practices of religions can address the human condition. . . . [Secularists] foresee successors to contemporary religious life that draw on a far broader range of cultural items -- borrowing from poets and film makers, musicians, artists, and scientists, cultivating social institutions to develop the sense of identity and community traditionally fostered by religion. (p. 94)

In chapter 4, Kitcher turns to "Mortality and Meaning": religions promise immortality, and a connection to the transcendent can confer meaning upon one's life; how can a secular outlook provide something similar? First, he reiterates that any meaning conferred by religion rests on a fiction: "In the end, any additional comforts religion offers depend on ignoring the arguments of Chapter 1, and settling for substantive doctrines that are almost certainly false" (p. 105). He goes on to suggest that "being dead is nothing to be frightened of" (96). He goes still further: following Bernard Williams ("The Makropulos Case: Reflections on the Tedium of Immortality") he also argues that a genuinely eternal life would "reach a point when immortality became tedious and burdensome . . . because there was nothing new under the sun" (p. 99); it would succumb to "weary staleness of repetition" (p. 113). Finally, a connection to the transcendental is not necessary for a meaningful life: "Mattering to others is what counts in conferring meaning" (p. 101). But just what is meaning, or a meaningful life? Here I found it hard to tell what Kitcher had in mind. And as for mattering to others: Hitler certainly mattered to those he persecuted; did this make his life a meaningful one?

In his final chapter, "Depth and Depravity", Kitcher turns to the thoughts that the secular life lacks "depth" and that there is a sort of deep depravity in human nature (depicted, for example, in Shakespeare's King Lear and Dostoyevsky's Brothers Karamazov) that can only be appreciated and addressed by religion. Kitcher disagrees. I wasn't sure just how depth and depravity figure in; but perhaps the central claim of the chapter is that "The idea of the religious life, permeated by doctrines, lore, and the rites of a particular tradition, gives way to a different vision: secular life, at it keenest, undertakes a passionate engagement with what it is to be human" (pp. 156-57). Secular humanists, therefore, believe that we human beings can flourish without religion. Kitcher argues that there is no proof that this isn't so; he adds that it's very much worthwhile trying to see if a fulfilling secular world can be achieved.

In what follows I'll concentrate on Kitcher's arguments against religion.

But first, what is the distinguishing feature of religion(s)? Kitcher's proposal: "Religions are distinguished by their invocation of something beyond the mundane physical world, some 'transcendent' realm, and they offer claims about this 'transcendent'" (p. 3). Prime examples of claims about the transcendent, of course, are the sorts of claims about God offered by Christians, Jews and Muslims.

Now what, precisely, is he saying about such claims? He speaks frequently of "secular skepticism," the core of which, "is skepticism about anything 'transcendent'" (p. 6). But Kitcher goes far beyond skepticism: as he sees things, any claims about a transcendent realm are "almost certainly false" (154); "there is every reason to think all of the clashing doctrines the world's religions have proposed about the transcendent are thoroughly false" (p. 124). The diversity of religious opinion shows, he says, that the source, whatever it is, of religious opinion is unreliable. Consider whatever cognitive processes it is that produce religious opinion: since those processes produce such a variety of mutually conflicting opinion, much or most of what they produce is false. Hence, those sources must be considered unreliable. And if they are unreliable, Kitcher thinks, the opinions they produce are almost certainly false: "Secularist doubt is prompted by probing the processes that generate specific beliefs about the transcendent. Those processes are so unreliable that all of the conflicting specific religious doctrines are, almost certainly, false" (19).

But why should we suppose that they are all almost certainly false? Couldn't it be that some of them are true and others false?

Why think that all of them are almost certainly false? As far as I can make out, Kitcher's argument is two-fold. First, Kitcher is impressed by the fact that "we find an astounding variety in religious doctrines. Impersonal forces, sacred places, ancestors, ghosts, spirits, demons and a wide variety of deities have all figured as supposed manifestations of the transcendent" (p. 7). So the first point seems to be that there is great religious diversity: there are very many different religions, and they frequently contradict each other. He is also impressed by the fact that religion is apparently culture-bound in a significant way. What religious opinions a person has seems to depend, at least in part, on when and where that person is brought up: "To face it clearly is to recognize that if, by some accident of early childhood, he had been transported to some distinct culture, brought up among aboriginal Australians, for example, he would now affirm a radically different set of doctrines" (p. 8).

But how strong are these points, taken as arguments for the falsehood of religious belief? Take the first: true, there is indeed a wide variety of religious belief; but how does it follow that they are all almost certainly false? Here we should distinguish particular religious beliefs, for example belief in God, from whole systems of religious belief, for example the 39 articles of Anglicanism or the Heidelberg Catechism. Such whole systems are incompatible with each other; but many such whole systems agree on some very important points -- the existence of the God of theism, for example. At that level there is vastly less diversity. So Kitcher's first argument wouldn't apply to belief in God.

But even for whole systems: there is certainly wide variety here, but how does it follow that they are all almost certainly false? Or even that any particular one is almost false? Kitcher's book is an exercise in philosophy. The variety of philosophical belief rivals that of religion: there are Platonists, nominalists, Aristotelians, Thomists, pragmatists, naturalists, theists, continental philosophers, existentialists, analytic philosophers (who also come in many varieties), and many other philosophical positions. Should we conclude that philosophical positions, including Kitcher's low opinion of religious belief, are all almost certainly false? I should think not. But then wouldn't the same be true for religious beliefs? The fact that others hold religious opinions incompatible with mine is not a good reason, just in itself, for supposing my beliefs false. After all, if I were to suppose my views false, I would once more be in the very same position: there would be very many others who held views incompatible with mine.

Kitcher's second point is also weak, at least as an argument for atheism. True, if I had been brought up as an Australian aboriginal, I would probably not hold the religious beliefs I do hold; no doubt I would not so much as have heard of those beliefs. But, once more, isn't the same true for Kitcher? If he had been brought up as an Australian aborigine, he would not have held the philosophical and religious beliefs he does hold -- including his skeptical beliefs about religion. But what follows from that? Surely not that the beliefs he does hold are almost certainly false. And doesn't the same go for the religious believer? If she had been brought up as an Australian aborigine, she would not have believed in God; but why should she conclude that her present beliefs are false and that there is no such person as God?

So first, neither the variety of religious opinion nor their relativity to cultural circumstance shows that these opinions are all almost certainly false. Should we conclude, instead, that it is irrational, or somehow contrary to reason to hold any particular religious opinion, at least if you are aware of this diversity? But again, the same question arises about philosophy. Kitcher is certainly aware of the diversity of philosophical opinion: does that mean that he is irrational in holding any particular philosophical position? His views about religion, for example? Does rationality require that he give them up? I certainly can't see why. On a given occasion he is struck by the enormous variety of philosophical opinion; perhaps then he should rethink his own opinions, looking at them again carefully and critically. But if he does so, and they still seem to him to be correct, isn't he entirely rational, entirely within his epistemic rights in continuing to hold them? Of course he might be mistaken; but isn't he, under those conditions, entirely rational in continuing to hold them? I should certainly think so.

But again, isn't the same thing true of the religious person? Apprised of the apparent relativity of her religious and philosophical beliefs to her circumstances of place, time and culture, she carefully reconsiders them. It seems to her that she is sometimes in contact with God when she prays; she can't see how there could be genuine right and wrong apart from God; on many occasions it has seemed to her that there must be such a person as God and that she is in God's presence. Of course she might be mistaken; but isn't she entirely rational, entirely within her epistemic rights in continuing to believe?

Still, it isn't just the variety of claims about the transcendent that occasions Kitcher's skepticism; it is also the particular character of the sources of religious belief. What are the processes that generate specific beliefs about the transcendent? According to Kitcher, "the bases of belief are remarkably similar across the entire array of religious traditions" (p. 7); and what these bases consist in, he says, are fundamentally cultural influence and tradition. "The beliefs of each tradition stand on much the same footing; complete symmetry prevails" (p. 8).

But is it really true that, as he says, "complete symmetry prevails"? Religious believers would certainly reject that idea. Christians and other believers in God, for example, may follow John Calvin in citing a "sensus divinitatis", a sort of grasp or apprehension of God's presence with which God has created us human beings; belief in Baal, or the Great Pumpkin, results from a corruption of the sensus divinitatis. To suppose that complete symmetry prevails, as Kitcher does, is already to reject, e.g., Christian or even theistic belief. The claim that complete symmetry prevails can't sensibly be proposed as part of an argument against religious belief.

Kitcher, however, isn't much impressed with the idea of a sensus divinitatis; this idea, he says, "is fruitless, a fig-leaf covering for dogmatism" (p. 8). It's clear, here, that Kitcher disapproves of this idea; but what exactly is his problem with it? I think, but can't be sure, that his idea is that believers in God cite the sensus divinitatis as their ground (evidence) for theistic belief; so taken, he thinks that idea is fruitless. But here, I think, he is seriously misconstruing Calvin and those who follow him. It isn't that those who think there is a sensus divinitatis appeal to this sensus as evidence for their belief in God. It isn't as if such people, if asked why they believe in God, if asked for evidence for their belief, will say, "Well, there is this sensus divinitatis, and it tells me that there is such a person." Not at all. It is rather that the supporters of the sensus find themselves with belief in God; they note that the same or something similar holds for much of the rest of humanity; so they conclude that there is a faculty or process that produces this belief. Of course they think this belief on their part and the parts of these others is true; and since they do think this belief is true, they call this process a "sensus", thus analogizing it to sense perception.

At bottom, therefore, Kitcher's brief against belief in the transcendent is just that such beliefs display great diversity and that "compete symmetry prevails" with respect to the origin of religious beliefs. But diversity as such doesn't prove much of anything (after all, the same holds for philosophical beliefs, including Kitcher's opinion about religion). And as for completely symmetry, to claim that it prevails is already to reject religious belief; hence it offers no promise as a decent way of arguing against such belief. As far as I can see, therefore, Kitcher's arguments for atheism are wholly unsuccessful.

According to Gary Gutting, "This is the most philosophically sophisticated and rigorous defense of atheism in the contemporary literature" (back cover blurb). As a believer in God, I'm tempted to hope this is true.