Life of Plato and On Plato First Alcibiades 1-9 & On Plato First Alcibiades 10-28

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Olympiodorus, Life of Plato and On Plato First Alcibiades 1-9, Michael Griffin (tr.), Bloomsbury, 2015, 245pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781474295642.

Olympiodorus, On Plato First Alcibiades 10-28, Michael Griffin (tr.), Bloomsbury, 2016, 231pp., $122.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472583994.

Reviewed by Dirk Baltzly, University of Tasmania


Olympiodorus was a teacher of Platonic philosophy in Alexandria in the first half of the 6th century CE. It seems likely that he was the last occupant of the chair in Platonic philosophy in that city who was not at least notionally Christian. In these two volumes, Michael Griffin translates Olympiodorus' commentary on the Alcibiades I attributed to Plato. Though the Greek text was edited by L. G. Westerink in 1956, Griffin's is the first modern language translation of Olympiodorus' work.[1]

First let us consider the dialogue that Olympiodorus discusses, since it will be one that is unfamiliar to many readers of Plato. The attribution of Alcibiades I to Plato was called into question by 19th-century German scholars. Friedrich Schleiermacher described Alcibiades I as 'very insignificant and poor . . . a few beautiful and genuinely Platonic passages floating sparsely scattered in a mass of inferior material.'[2] This hostility to the Alcibiades I is of a piece with the 19th-century reaction against the Neoplatonic reading of Plato. Since the Neoplatonists regarded Alcibiades I as the 'gateway' to Plato's philosophy, it is unsurprising that someone with Schleiermacher's view of the value of Neoplatonism should regard it as unworthy of the real Plato. This is not to say that Schleiermacher's verdict was utterly unfounded: even today there is no consensus on the authorship of the Alcibiades I. (Alcibiades II is almost universally regarded as inauthentic. Accordingly, in what follows I'll simply refer to 'the Alcibiades', meaning thereby the first dialogue with that name.) Its status as a genuine work of Plato has been defended by Julia Annas and Nicholas Denyer. Yet others are not convinced.[3]

The underlying cause of the unease that many scholars feel about the Alcibiades is the very thing that made ancient Platonists suppose that it was the best way to introduce Plato's philosophy. It contains so many themes that come up in Plato's other dialogues that it feels as if it is tailor-made -- indeed, a bit too tailor-made -- to introduce ideas for further exploration. For those who are not familiar with the dialogue, let us consider some of these connections.

Socrates' initial approach to Alcibiades rehearses the distinction, familiar from the Symposium and the Phaedrus, between the love of young men for their bodies and the love of their souls. Alcibiades' political ambitions are questioned through an interrogation that shows that, while he supposes himself to know about justice, he cannot say from whom or when he learned about it (cf. Protagoras 327a, ff). Socrates' questioning leads Alcibiades to the brink of other Platonic theses -- that what is just is what is truly expedient (cf. Gorgias) and that justice arises in a city when 'each does his own' (cf. Republic). The peculiar form of wisdom attributed to Socrates in the Apology -- the awareness of the limits of his own knowledge -- is precisely what Alcibiades is said to lack. He suffers 'double ignorance', since he both fails to know what is necessary for the political life and fails to know that he is ignorant in this regard.

When this double ignorance is exposed he vows to follow Socrates' injunction to 'care for the self.' But such care presupposes a correct understanding of what the self is and the dialogue investigates this question by drawing a three-fold distinction between the body, the soul, and the composite of the two. Socrates argues that the body is merely an instrument for the soul and subordinate to it (cf. Phaedo 80a). The real self is the soul. Near the end of the dialogue Socrates finally explains why he, alone among the Athenians, is essential to the realization of Alcibiades' political ambitions. Socrates proposes to provide the mirror within which Alcibiades may know himself. Alcibiades' soul is like an eye: it sees, but cannot see itself. It is only by seeing its reflection in another's eye -- and in particular in the pupil of the eye -- that it can see itself. Socrates advises him to look to another soul in order to gain self-knowledge, and in particular to look to the region of another's soul in which wisdom exists. This seat of wisdom in the soul resembles god and so, looking to it, Alcibiades will come to understand all that is divine and so will best know himself (Alc. 133c). Since knowledge of the self was previously agreed to be temperance or self-control (Alc. 131b; cf. Charmides), he will acquire this virtue. Accordingly, he will know what things pertain to what is really him (i.e. the virtues of the soul) and what things pertain merely to what belongs to him (i.e. the body). The dialogue ends with a reversal of roles (cf. reciprocated love in Phaedrus 255c). Alcibiades will now be the one who pursues Socrates.

One response to the abundance of allusions to Platonic themes in the Alcibiades is to regard it with suspicion. Thus Paul Shorey wrote:

If we attribute it to Plato we have to assume the improbability that he thought it worthwhile to elaborate a tedious, if scholastically convenient, summary of a long series of ideas and points that are better and more interestingly expressed in other dialogues. . .[4]

The other response is to regard it as the perfect introduction to Plato. This was the judgement of antiquity from at least the second century of the common era.

In the introduction to volume 1 Griffin notes that the Platonist Albinus of Smyrna was the first person we know of to suggest that the Alcibiades should be the starting point of Platonic education (Introductio in Platonem, 15-16 (Teubner)). The most important figure in the subsequent history of commentaries on the Alcibiades, however, was Iamblichus (c. 245-320 CE) who placed it first in the reading order of Plato's dialogues, since he took it to contain all Plato's philosophy 'as if in a seed' (Iamblichus, fr. 1).[5] Iamblichus identified twelve dialogues as core to the teaching of Plato.

Crucially for the commentary tradition, the teaching of Plato's philosophy was not thought to aim simply at making people aware of the contents of his dialogues or even at an understanding Plato's philosophy. Rather, progress through the works of Plato was thought to be correlated with a moral advancement through different gradations of the four cardinal virtues (wisdom, courage, self-control and justice). In reading Plato's works with the leader of the school, the student does not merely become well-read in Plato but achieves the telos or goal of living: assimilation to the divine. The Platonic commentaries written by the Neoplatonists have their origins in this teaching activity. Accordingly they are best seen not as dry scholasticism, but as the last remaining clues about a philosophical way of life centred on spiritual transformation through the engagement with the works of Plato and Aristotle (among others). They are our windows into predominantly pagan textual communities that were extinguished in the Christianisation of the late Roman Empire.

Iamblichus' decision to place the Alcibiades at the beginning of the study of Plato, together with the manner in which the Neoplatonists taught, meant that many Platonists produced commentaries on this work. The commentaries of Iamblichus and Damascius we know only by report. But in addition to the commentary of Olympiodorus, we still have first part of a commentary by Proclus (412-85 CE). While the text of Plato's dialogue occupies 103a-135a in the standard Stephanus pagination, Proclus' commentary stops abruptly at 116b. We know that there was more, since Olympiodorus discusses parts of Proclus' commentary and we can glean some idea of how he continued from the work that Griffin translates in these two volumes. Damacius' Alcibiades commentary we know only indirectly through Olympiodorus.

Unlike Proclus' commentary, Olympiodorus' commentary has been transmitted to us apo phonês ('from the voice of'). This means that our text derives from notes taken by an auditor of Olympiodorus' lectures. The classroom context is evident from the division of the text into 28 lectures. Within most lectures we are first presented with an overall discussion of a segment of Plato's text followed by more detailed remarks on specific points in the text. A line of text that is quoted for discussion is called a lemma and the lemmata from the Neoplatonic commentaries often provide evidence of alternative versions of the text that were once in circulation.

So much then for background information on the Alcibiades and the commentary tradition on it. Let us now turn to a description and evaluation of Griffin's introduction to, and translation of, Olympiodorus' commentary.

Volume 1 opens with an introduction that is longer than usual for the books in this series (66 pages). As is standard for the Ancient Commentators volumes, departures from the Greek text of the edition that is being translated are then noted. Griffin regards the text produced by Westerink as very good and proposes few departures. Volume 1 then translates an account of the life of Plato that is prefaced to Olympiodorus' commentary proper. Following this we have nine lectures that take us up to Alcibiades 110d. The ratio of notes to translation is about average for the series with 58 pages of endnotes on 90 pages of translation. Neoplatonic texts are replete with technical terminology and, as usual, there is an index to page and line numbers where these terms occur. For those who do not read Greek, there is the series' standard English to Greek glossary. Thus if the Greekless reader knows that he wants to study the places in the text where justice is mentioned, the glossary will tell him that dikaios and dikaiosunê are the relevant Greek terms that he should use the Greek word index to locate.

Griffin's introduction to volume 1 is wide-ranging. It begins with an introduction to Olympiodorus and the teaching context in Alexandria. Griffin enters into the debate about the extent to which Olympiodorus' teaching and philosophical views softened the unapologetically pagan character of his predecessors' Platonism. (The Platonic school in Alexandria continued to exist after the closure of its sister institution in Athens in 529 by Christian authorities.) In his lectures he often tells his Christian students how they may interpret, for instance, references to the traditional Hellenic gods symbolically so as to make Plato's text consistent with their religious commitments. Griffin agrees with Harold Tarrant that Olympiodorus' alleged 'extreme pliability' is not simply a response to being a lone pagan philosopher in an increasingly Christian city. Rather, he supposes nearly all discourse has symbolic significance and needs decoding. This includes the surface meaning of Plato's dialogues.

From the particular circumstances of Olympiodorus' teaching, Griffin proceeds to a synopsis of the various gradations of the Neoplatonic virtues and their correlation with progress through the reading order of Plato's dialogues. He also makes a cogent case for the role of the Alcibiades as a turning point in a person's moral progress. Reading this dialogue was thought to initiate a re-orientation of the soul away from innate endowments (natural virtues) and those that arise from Aristotelian habituation (ethical virtues) toward a gradation of virtue that involves only the soul's relation to its irrational parts and not to the body. This is the level of civic or constitutional virtue that the Neoplatonists thought was realised through reading the Gorgias, the next dialogue in the reading sequence. (The Republic also concerns civic virtue, but it was not a normal part of the Neoplatonic curriculum.) More controversially, Griffin argues that the Life of Plato that forms the first part of Olympiodorus' commentary can also be read in terms of the scale of virtues, much as Marinus' Life of Proclus illustrates Proclus' progression toward the highest virtues. That the Platonic 'lives' or bioi are not factual biographies in our sense is widely agreed. But Griffin's claim that the enumeration of events in Olympiodorus' Life of Plato has a neat matching with the sequence of natural, habitual, civic, purificatory, contemplative, paradigmatic and priestly virtues is much more controversial.

Another section of Griffin's introduction reviews the ancient history of the Alcibiades. Those interested in the authenticity question will appreciate the appendix in which he assembles the testimonia for the dialogue century by century in the form of a table. A further section sketches the views of two of Olympiodorus' predecessors on the Alcibiades: Proclus and Damascius. In section five of the introduction Griffin finally turns to a general description of Olympiodorus' reading of the dialogue. The introduction concludes with a very brief discussion of the challenges associated with translating an apo phonês text.

The contents of Volume 2 follow the same pattern as volume 1. In some ways this is disconcerting, for though Griffin's introduction here is shorter (31 pages including endnotes) much of it is a condensed version of volume 1's introduction. He omits discussion of the life of Plato and the reception history of the Alcibiades, but again goes over the scale of virtues and its relation to the Platonic curriculum. I suppose this provides some context for the reader who has acquired volume 2 in the absence of volume 1. But if you read both volumes you clearly have the sense that we've been here before.

Volume 2 also includes an overview of topics of the 28 lectures that make up the work, as well as the principal divisions into which Olympiodorus supposed that the text falls. This would have been very helpful in volume 1 and its placement here occasions the thought 'Better late than never.' An appendix lists Olympiodorus' other extant and lost works, as well as the attribution to him of the anonymous Prolegomena to Platonic Philosophy.

A reader who has volume 1 may be inclined to skip over the introduction to volume 2. Some of the sentences are nearly the same. But, on the other hand, Griffin is also much more forthcoming in volume 2 on some points. Thus, he concedes here that the nearly all the philosophically substantial points in Olympiodorus' commentary are dependent upon Proclus or Damascius. Olympiodorus' own original contribution consists chiefly in clever ways to attempt to reconcile his illustrious predecessors.

There is one final oddity about the marriage of volumes 1 and 2. The Greek word index to volume 2 covers both volumes, thus reproducing the index of volume 1 and adding to it occurrences of Greek words that appear in volume 2. This is useful, of course, but unless you read carefully you may be initially confused when you glance at the first term (abussos) and find a reference to a Greek page and line (19,7) that isn't in the book that you are currently holding.

The notes to the translation in volume 2 are briefer. But to some degree this matches the character of Olympiodorus' commentary. Several of the later lectures are far less meaty and philosophically interesting than the earlier ones. Indeed, Lecture 26 is presented merely as an 'abstract' (aposêmeiôsis) of Olympiodorus' lecture and takes up only three pages. This pattern is not uncommon with the few Platonic commentaries that have survived in full. Hermias' commentary on the Phaedrus, though complete, trails off toward the end of the dialogue and contains more summary than analysis and interpretation. But this is more understandable in the case of the Phaedrus commentary than it is in the case of an Alcibiades commentary. The portion of the Phaedrus that most occupied the Neoplatonists was Socrates' recantation with its images of the soul as charioteer following after the gods for a tour of the intelligible world. But the climax of the Alcibiades comes right at the end when Alcibiades is directed to see himself in the pupil (sc. the intellectual part) of Socrates' own soul. Did Olympiodorus' note-taker flag? Or did Olympiodorus have reasons of his own for not inquiring too deeply into key issues in dialogue's concluding pages?

It is at this climax of the dialogue that Griffin's discussion is somewhat disappointing. There are two sections in our Platonic texts that are uncertain. One occurs at 134d1-e7 where the text says that the person who acts with self-control and justice 'acts with a view to what is divine and bright, as we said before.' It seems that this backward reference is to the context of the other excised passage earlier at 133c8-17. One version of the text asserts that god is clearer and brighter than the best part of the human soul and so we will best know ourselves by looking first to god and, at the level of the human, to the virtue of the soul. In the course of Lecture 28 Olympiodorus comments on the text of 134d1-e7 but not on 133c8-17. The text of 133c8-17 is sometimes inserted on the basis of what the Christian writer Eusebius says, purportedly quoting the Alcibiades.

Tarrant has attempted to reconstruct a different version of 133c8, ff on the basis of evidence in Proclus and Olympiodorus (esp. in Alc. 8.2-12 and 217.12-16).[6] At issue is the question of the extent and manner in which human souls (and Socrates' soul in particular) can be divine. While Tarrant's article appears in Griffin's bibliography, Griffin does not mention this bold conjecture at any point or discuss it. This is disappointing, particularly since Griffin has offered views on Olympiodorus and Christianity. The ideal of 'assimilation (homoiôsis) to God' is common to both pagan and Christian Platonists. But the distinction between pagan henotheism and Christian monotheism means that each camp will differ in its assessment of what such assimilation can accomplish. Tarrant's conjecture and the question it raises about changes to the Platonic text raises this general issue in a concrete and particular way.

Griffin's translation reads well. He does not translate in a way that slavishly reproduces the often labyrinthine sentence structures that characterise the commentators. Thus, just to take a fairly random example, 217.4-15 in the Greek is a single sentence with multiple embedded clauses and a parenthetical remark that digresses for three lines. In Griffin's English translation, this is broken up into several sentences and reads well.

Ancient Greek is a spare, elliptical language in which context alone worked to supply unstated subjects, direct objects, verbs and so on. Griffin signals places where he provides a word that is meant to be supplied by context. This is the standard practice for this series (and for good translations of late antique texts generally). Sometimes he seems a bit too scrupulous about this. Thus in 217.4-6 we have: 'Up to this point, the discussion has been about the 'self', and [Socrates] has taught about who the civic person is. From this point forward, he is also speaking about the 'self itself', that is, the purificatory and contemplative [person].' The words 'civic person' correspond to politikos anthrôpos. But there's really no reasonable alternative to supplying 'person' (or 'man' if you want a translation that sounds old-fashioned and gendered). Given the definite article and gender of tou kathartikou kai theôrêtikou, it can't be 'virtue'. Given the proximity of anthrôpos in the previous line, one can only understand 'person'. So the square brackets seem like a gratuitous intrusion.

As is standard for the series, Griffin also supplies transliterated Greek where he is dealing with technical terminology. Thus at 22.8 he writes: 'Love is intermediate between essence (ousia) and activity (energeia).' Some people who read Greek and know their Neoplatonism may find this a needless intrusion, but I think that it is in fact good practice. It permits the Greekless reader to get a sense of the core technical vocabulary for Neoplatonism is. Other times supplying the transliterated terms helps the reader see etymological connections that would have strengthened various inferences for Olympiodorus' audience. Thus at 12.13-14 Griffin has: 'Socrates acts as a midwife for souls (psukhai), and does not put theories into the young, as though into lifeless (apsukhos) vessels.'

All in all, Griffin's two volumes are a considerable scholarly achievement. They open up a window into a world in which philosophy had a very different role and self-conception. This is an important thing to think about at this moment in time. We seem to be entering one of those not infrequent periods when philosophy's nature and its relation to broader intellectual culture is again a topic for philosophers. Griffin's introduction on the virtues and psychic transformation is particularly valuable in this regard. It should invite both specialists and general readers to reflect on what we are really doing when we teach philosophy by providing a contrast with our own more modest self-conception.

[1] Westerink, L. G. 1956. Olympiodorus Commentary on the First Alcibiades of Plato (North Holland Publishing).

[2] Schleiermacher, F. 1836. Schleiermacher's Introductions to the Dialogues of Plato (J. and J.J. Deighton), 330

[3] For a survey of the arguments and a list of the proponents on each side, see Jirsa, J. 2009. 'Authenticity of the Alcibiades: some reflections' Listy filologické, 82, 225-44.

[4] Shorey, P. 1933. What Plato Said (The University of Chicago Press), 145.

[5] Dillon, J. 1973. Iamblichi Chalcidensis in Platonis Dialogos Commentariorum Fragmenta (E. J. Brill).

[6] Tarrant, H. 2007. 'Olympiodorus and Proclus on the climax of the Alcibiades', International Journal of the Platonic Tradition, 1, 3-29.