Life, War, Earth: Deleuze and the Sciences

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John Protevi, Life, War, Earth: Deleuze and the Sciences, University of Minnesota Press, 2013, 256pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780816681020.

Reviewed by Todd May, Clemson University


Philosophers often groan when philosophical ideas are pried loose from their immediate context and applied to fields other than philosophy. There is good reason for this. Often, those who have not taken the time to understand the philosophical ideas in the first place warp the original concepts and positions. Others may not have committed to study the fields with which these concepts and positions are engaged. Finally, there is the superfluous activity of showing how these philosophical ideas are a lot like those scientific or literary or political ideas, resulting in a similitude without enlightenment.

John Protevi's work avoids all of these pitfalls. He is a strict and rigorous reader of Deleuze's philosophical corpus, elusive as it is. As far as I can tell (his knowledge here certainly outstrips mine), he displays a deep familiarity with the extra-philosophical fields with which he is engaged. And one walks away from his engagements with a deeper sense of the issues and how to frame them than one walked in with. In his previous work Political Affect, Protevi not only argued for the relevance of Deleuze's work for contemporary developmental systems theory and philosophy of mind, but used it to understand how the political field is molded and oriented at the affective level, and along the way offered important insights in cases such as the governmental response to Hurricane Katrina and the controversy surrounding the Terri Schiavo case.

The current work, which originally appeared in the form of independent essays and conference papers, is less directly concerned with politics -- although it is never very far from Protevi's focus -- and more taken up with how a reading of Deleuze can help frame certain areas in contemporary science. The book is divided into three sections, preceded by two introductions. The first introduction offers an overview of the central Deleuzian concepts that will be put in play in the rest of the text. Readers of Deleuze will be familiar with these concepts -- virtual, actual, intensive, individuation, dramatization. Nevertheless, Protevi's explanation of them is clear and fresh. Roughly, the burden of this chapter is to show how these concepts allow us to think a holism (my term, not Protevi's) in which the terms do not pre-exist their relations but instead are defined by them. Moreover, those relationships are dynamic, leading to a dynamism of the terms themselves. The second introduction concerns the thought of Francisco Varela, a key figure in current biological and cognitive work, who introduced a holism into biology that more recent thinkers, for example Evan Thompson, have taken up. These two sections also familiarize the reader with Protevi's term body (or bodies) politic. The term stands for the way bodies -- individual, social, and even subindividual -- are molded and even created through a field of interaction with a variety of material factors that often work below the level of conscious awareness.

The first section is taken up with the question of war, and in particular how different aspects of war come together to create what might be called military subjects. The unwieldy but suggestive title of the first chapter allows a glimpse of the kind of holism Protevi is after: "Geo-hydro-solar-bio-techno-politics." (He apologizes for the "barbarous nature" (p. 41) of the title, apt thought it is. This is in keeping with his attempt to avoid unnecessary jargon and to ask forgiveness when jargon does appear.) In this chapter, which sets the tone for much of the rest of the book, he shows how geological, hydrological, solar, and biological formations and constraints interact to create specific political formations. For instance, he shows how "we can claim olive oil as a key factor in the genesis of Athenian democracy." (p. 55) The general idea here is that oil stores solar energy, which can be used for food and for lamps. When Solon outlawed Athenian exports, with the exception of olive oil, this fostered a class of people who would work as oil merchants. However, the viability of such exports required a naval activity in order for safe passage of the oil, which in turn led to the creation of Athenian naval power and eventually its empire. Things would have been very different, for instance, if Athens had been land-locked. Here we can see the holism of dynamic interacting factors at work.

If the first chapter works with a supra-individual dynamism, the second chapter, which takes up the question of how one can train a person to kill another, is oriented toward the sub-individual level. In such training, there is a dual difficulty to be overcome. On the one hand, most humans are not oriented toward killing one another directly, in face to face combat. On the other, although certain practices can train one to overcome this orientation, they generally provoke a rage response, which is difficult to control. So the challenge becomes one of how to turn the ability to kill on and off. Among contemporary methods of addressing this problem are the dehumanization of the enemy and simulation-training. But, as many have pointed out (including a student of mine who was in Iraq), and as PTSD has amply shown, this training is at best only partially successful, and often at a heavy psychological cost.

The third chapter takes up the role of music in military training. It is preceded by a long and important discussion of Deleuze's concept of affect. Affect, for Deleuze, is not a feeling, which is instead "the subjective appropriation of affect." (p. 74) Rather, it is the ability of a body to act and to be acted upon. This happens differently with different bodies. For instance, certain bacteria are acted upon by glucose, but this is only because glucose can be a form of food for them. Other bodies, for whom glucose has no meaning, are not affected by it -- they do not act and are not acted upon by it. This means, among other things, that what a body is and does is inseparable from its environment, which in turn is inseparable from that body. This does not mean, Protevi insists, that things are entirely plastic all the way down.

I think it is important to rescue a minimal notion of human nature from extreme social constructivism and to hold that rage episodes are individuations of a multiplicity encompassing variation in genetic inheritances, environmental input in the form of subjectification practices, and developmental plasticity. Even with all that variation, there is still remarkable similarity in what a full rage episode looks like. (p. 78)

Here we can see a theme to which Protevi will return. Even though, for Deleuze, the actual emerges from a dynamic virtual, this is not a one-way street. If it were, then Deleuze would, as Protevi later notes, be a sort of Platonist: an unchanging virtual issues out into the actual. The actual constrains and forms the virtual just as the virtual actualizes itself. The dynamic holism in which terms are a product of their relations does not entail that those terms, once formed, cannot in their turn affect (in the Deleuzian sense) the relations with which they are immersed.

In the case of war and music, there are interactions between the evolution of affections of which humans are capable, the type of war that is being fought, and the music that is associated with that type of war. Around 1200 B.C.E, when barbarian peoples conquered more sedentary groups in the ancient Near East,

we can speculate that through an evolutionary process with success in warfare as a selection pressure, the barbarian hill peoples . . . experimented with war dances and songs to hit on critical points in provoking neural firing patterns that triggered evolutionarily embedded rage circuits. (p. 95)

The second part of the book focuses on the interaction between a Deleuzian framework and what has come to be called the embodied mind or "4EA approach (embodied, embedded, enactive, extended, affective)" to cognitive science. This approach, whose roots lie in Continental thinkers like Husserl, Heidegger, and Merleau-Ponty, has been taken up recently by Susan Hurley, Andy Clark, Evan Thompson, Alva Noë, and others. It treats the mind not as internal to a person, but rather as an emergence from a set of "internal" and "external" factors. The scare quotes around these latter terms indicate that, in keeping with Deleuze's thought, we should not consider these factors as pre-existing their relationship.

One of the virtues of this section of the book is to bring together the phenomenological tradition from which the 4EA theorists borrow and Deleuze's thought, which is often considered (even by Deleuze himself) as a rejection of that tradition. As Protevi argues, a sophisticated approach to phenomenology does not see it as reducing experience to what appears to a subject but rather as proceeding from that appearance to an understanding of what must underlie it. Taken that way, Deleuze's transcendental empiricism, which seeks the conditions of real rather than possible experience, lies at not nearly as far a remove from say, Merleau-Ponty's phenomenology of the lived body, as many have thought. Here Protevi provides an important corrective to many received views of the recent history of French philosophy.

The four chapters of the second section take up not only the general compatibility of Deleuze's thought with the 4EA approach, but consider specific examples like that of the shooting of Gabrielle Giffords and gendering practices that lead to greater rates of depression among women. In the latter case, he argues,

We need to think in terms of a range of gendering practices that are distributed in a society at various sites (family, school, church, media, playground, sports field) with variable goals, intensities, and efficacies. These multiply situated gendering practices resonate or clash with each other and with myriad other practices (racializing, classing, religionizing, nationalizing, neighborhoodizing ["that's the way we roll"]). (p. 135)

Seen this way, there are no particular elements of gendering (and their intersecting) practices that are unaffected by others. Moreover, the relations among these practices are characterized by particular tensions (intensities) and what Deleuze calls singularities -- points at which the normal run of things alters and something new breaks out. This something new could be the proliferation of depression among women (say, when pressure to work and simultaneously raise a family become embedded in the larger culture), or, opposed to this, a new feminist movement that rejects those cultural pressures. Which way things will turn at a singularity is difficult, if not impossible, to predict. In fact, given the complexity of the 4EA/Deleuzian approach Protevi articulates, it may be impossible to tell when one has reached a singularity except retrospectively.

The final chapters of the book approach biology and evolution from a Deleuzian perspective. Among the arguments Protevi makes is to propose a Deleuzian "panpsychism," the idea that, in some sense, mind pervades everything. This mind is not, of course, an organic mind, but rather a process of interaction and emergence for which the distinction between the organic and the inorganic is less important ontologically than it has often seemed. In defending this view, whose roots we can see in earlier essays, Protevi throws out this challenge:

When cognitive capacities are at stake, a panpsychist would say that mind gets more complex as we find life, but it doesn't radically emerge with life. A Cartesian radical emergentist would say that there is dead unmindful matter that when properly arranged becomes living and minded. But is that really less strange than the panpsychist position? (p. 194)

In fact, if we think of mind as no longer the internal property of a person, but rather as an interactive emergence, we have set the stage for such a view and such a challenge.

There is more to this book than I have indicated here, both theoretically and in concrete analyses: E. coli, RNA, and the Occupy Movement all make appearances. Throughout, however, Protevi offers careful and rigorous discussion rather than glossing either the philosophical or (as far as I can tell) biological, political, or musicological issues. He is also careful to recognize when he is taking up a controversial perspective among the latter. The book could serve both those who are new to Deleuze as a way of understanding his thought and those who are familiar with his thought as a way of seeing how he can enlighten us on a variety of contemporary scientific issues. In addition, it runs another in a series of recent bridges across the "analytic/Continental divide."

There are, of course, many questions one might ask here in reflecting on Protevi's view. I will close with one. Deleuze offers us a general ontology that is rooted in a conception of difference rather than identity. It seems to me right to say that the relationality Protevi discusses is central in the emergence of mind, politics, biology, etc. However, should this fact point us in the direction of a robust ontological framework of the kind Deleuze provides, or instead in the opposite direction, toward an ontological austerity? The latter position would not deny any of the phenomena to which Protevi has called our attention, but would take the lesson of this to be, not that there is a virtual realm of difference, intensities, and singularities, but rather that we don't know what there is beyond what we currently understand (and, of course, even that is fallible). This position would allow for relationality in the phenomena discovered. It would also allow for the possibility that there can be more or less stable identities. It would recognize the complexity Protevi has analyzed but infer from that complexity that we should abjure rather than posit a deeper explanatory ontology.

Among the many merits of Life,War, Earth is that it allows us to approach such an important question more rigorously than we would have otherwise, as well as offering us a rigorous defense of one way to answer it.