Life's Values: Pleasure, Happiness, Well-Being, and Meaning

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Alan H. Goldman, Life's Values: Pleasure, Happiness, Well-Being, and Meaning, Oxford University Press, 2018, 186pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198829737.

Reviewed by Stewart Goetz, Ursinus College


Alan Goldman's book is an important contribution to the philosophical literature on the topics listed in the subtitle. It is carefully written and argumentatively rich, and I highly recommend it. After briefly summarizing Goldman's treatments of pleasure, happiness, and well-being, I will devote the rest of this review to discussion and evaluation of his treatment of meaning in life, which I found to be the volume's most thought-provoking part.

According to Goldman, there are different types of pleasure. One is pleasure as a sensation. It has both a physical cause and spatial location in the body (e.g., sexual pleasure or the pleasure of eating food) and is mental in the sense of being private to the subject who experiences it. Pleasures as sensations are not intentional in nature. The second type is pleasure as a kind of intentional attitude. It is taking pleasure in various objects and activities, and it need not feel a certain way. The third kind of pleasure is the feeling one has after a major achievement or unexpected fortuitous change for the better. Goldman calls it pure feeling pleasure. It has no specific bodily location but does take an intentional object (the achievement or change). Each type of pleasure has its opposite counterpart in pain. A bodily pain has a physical cause and spatial location; a pain as an intentional attitude can be expressed by "I am pained or distressed by X"; and there are pains (feelings of depression) felt after failures or unexpected changes for the worse.

Goldman rejects the reality of non-natural value properties and, thus, the objective, intrinsic goodness of pleasure. He acknowledges that many people identify pleasure and happiness, but insists that happiness is not hedonistic in nature and, therefore, not a balance of positive over negative feelings. A person can be experiencing good sensations or having positive intentional attitudes "and yet not be happy if at the same time she judges that her life is not going well overall" (43). Again,

one can feel nothing but the pleasant sensation of a massage without being happy at that time, if one is thinking of some recent depressing news while feeling the pleasant sensation (the thought need not involve any opposing negative sensation) . . .  On the other hand, one can feel happy about a reduction in pain while still having only a painful sensation. If my dentist begins drilling without Novocain, and then gives a shot to silence my screams, I feel happy about that while still feeling a mild sensation of pain. (46)

What, then, is happiness? Goldman believes happiness in the primary sense of feeling happy is an emotion, where an emotion is a multi-component state including (i) an implicit judgment (which has a positive nature and is about one's life or significant aspects of it going well), (ii) a feeling (positive in nature), (iii) a physical symptom (smiling), and (iv) a behavioral disposition (energy, openness), though there can be borderline cases that fail to include all four components. The judgment component of happiness is central because it typically causes the feeling, physical symptom, and behavioral disposition that compose happiness. "When one feels happy, one implicitly judges that one's life is going well" (57) at the time of the judgment, though the scope of the judgment can be wider and extend into the past (e.g., when reflecting on past achievements) or into the future (e.g., when anticipating future achievements), as well as concern one's whole life or a major aspect of it. Moreover, the judgment involved in happiness can be incorrect: one can judge that one's life is going well when it isn't. In this case, happiness and well-being come apart. The feeling of pleasure involved in full-blown happiness is that of pure feeling: it has no specific bodily location and takes an intentional object, namely one's life or an aspect of it. While happiness in its primary sense is an emotion, there is a happy mood (a disposition to feel happy in its primary emotional sense) and a happy temperament (a disposition to be in a happy mood).

Goldman maintains people confuse pleasure and happiness as sources of well-being with what well-being is. He writes: "well-being is the all-inclusive category of personal value or welfare" (4), "of what makes a person's life go well for him or her" (73), "of goods for individual persons" (78). The goods that make a person's life go well are not found on any objective list, but are "personally valuable because rationally desired" (85). Desires are rational if they are coherent (the satisfaction of some does not prevent the satisfaction of others more central, deeper, and stronger) and relevantly informed (roughly, the properties of the desired object are as the person conceives them; when this is not the case, well-being can be undermined: for example, I might desire to climb a ladder which, were I to know that its rungs are weak and that stepping on them would lead to an injury, I would not desire to climb). "When such [coherent and informed] desires are being fulfilled, a person's life is going well for him or her, whatever its effects on others" (85). There is a radical pluralism in sources of personal well-being, so any list of goods that contribute to well-being will be open-ended and relative to the individual. Nevertheless, pleasure and happiness are rationally desired by most, if not all, people and because they are desired they are constituents of well-being. The fact that we rationally desire happiness helps explain why so many people believe happiness is the same thing as well-being. The explanation begins with the judgment component of happiness, where the judgment is an evaluation that one's life has a positive level of well-being. Because we rationally desire happiness and happiness itself includes a judgment about the satisfaction of our rational desires (where this satisfaction is our well-being), "happiness not only reflects well-being, but is extensionally equivalent to its more transparent and higher levels . . . Happiness tracks welfare and is therefore easily confused with it" (64-5).

Finally, what about meaning in life? Goldman maintains that "when we ask the question of the meaning in or of our lives, we . . . want to know the meaning of our lives to ourselves" (118-19). He believes meaning in our lives is a value that is distinct from pleasure and happiness, because it is not a sensation, attitude, or feeling (the varieties of pleasure), and not an emotion (which happiness is). And while meaning in life is, like pleasure and happiness, rationally desired, and is therefore a constituent of well-being when the desire for it is satisfied, it is not the same thing as well-being. So what is meaning in life? Goldman believes we should not overlook how philosophers in the past -- either those committed to monotheism (theism, for short), or Hegelians convinced of the goal of Absolute Spirit, or Marxists who espoused the final end of communist society  -- conceptualized the meaning of life in terms of "overarching religious or historical narratives" (121). Theists (following Goldman, I will focus my comments on traditional theism) typically thought of the meaning of life in terms of God's plan and the way that human lives fit into it. God's plan was considered an overarching narrative in which the lives of individual human beings acquire meaning as wholes by being integrated into a larger whole in which they play their parts. "Our lives [are] supposed to have meaning by fitting God's purpose or plan that [involves] all of us" (121).

Goldman believes there are problems with this conception of the meaning of life, beginning with human ignorance of the content of a divine plan. It is far from clear that "fitting a plan of some other being or force, a plan of which we have no knowledge, could provide our lives with meaning" (123). He writes that: "in the absence of knowledge of some all-encompassing plan, being a part of it could not mean anything to an agent herself" (123), though it might have meaning to God. An additional problem stems from size: given the temporal size of God's narrative of the universe (think here of a cosmic history of the universe), the meaning of our lives is swallowed up and becomes invisible in the vast scheme of things, so that those lives will ultimately not make a difference that really matters. One other problem is that the idea of a divine narrative as the source of the meaning of life is largely irrelevant to most philosophical and irreligious people today who write on life's meaning. While the idea of a divine narrative of life used to capture an "ordinary and natural sense of meaning" (122), that sense has seen its day.

Goldman believes that instead of thinking of meaning as deriving from an external source that assigns us places in an overarching cosmic narrative, we should think of meaning as something that is internal to and derivative from relations between events in our lives:   "events [in our lives] are meaningful when they are important and valuable (or disvaluable) to us" (125), and they get their importance and value to us by ultimately being related to events preceding and following them whose occurrence is explained in terms of the goals/purposes to which they are the means, where these goals derive their value from being desired. Our desires, then, are the ultimate source of the more or less coherent narratives which we live. The deeper, more important, and lasting the desires/concerns of an agent are the more meaningful her life will be. Thus,

not all valuable activities have great meaning for the individuals engaged in them, only those that relate diverse events over time. Helping an old person across the street . . . or seeing a beautiful flower or bird may not confer much meaning unless part of a broader [narrative] plan, however good these actions or experiences might be. (145)

So meaning in life is a matter of degree, and our lives are more or less meaningful depending upon the degree to which they are filled with more or less meaningful events.

Goldman stresses that meaning is always person relative. One person might organize his life around the goal of watching baseball games: he "scrupulously plans trips to various stadiums in different cities, collects souvenirs from these trips, collects and trades baseball memorabilia, gradually building a collection that reveals the history of the sport" (135), etc. Such a narrative might not be of any interest to another person. Similarly, shooting a ball through a hoop, as opposed to throwing it high in the air, becomes meaningful when "nested in a connected set of concerns validated by a social structure that orients [it] toward various broader goals. . . . For Lebron James it is the outcome of countless hours of practice, part of winning a game, making the playoffs, being rich and famous" (127). For someone else, throwing a ball through a hoop is as meaningless as throwing it up in the air. "Agents pursue projects that reflect their own values, and meaning derives from the way that pursuit of these concerns [desires] connects various activities and events into intelligible narratives" (145). Goldman insists that when philosophers turn away from the idea of meaning as attaching to events in relationship to each other and a subject who values them in a lived narrative, they are changing the subject.

Is Goldman's account of meaning in life convincing? Given his belief in the relevance of the idea of an overarching theistic narrative for his own account of meaning in life, I will raise various concerns about his treatment of that concept. To begin, theists who think in terms of a cosmic narrative also think in terms of the purpose of life. How do they think the latter relates to the meaning of life? Many (a very short list includes Anselm, Aquinas, Augustine, Boethius, C. S. Lewis) believe the purpose of life is that we experience perfect happiness (felicity or beatitude), where happiness is intrinsically good and makes life worth living (a matter of value). Moreover, because these theists believe they know the purpose of life, they also believe that if God's grand narrative is not ultimately about the experience of perfect happiness, then whatever it is ultimately about has to be consistent with the possibility of people experiencing felicity. In other words, for these theists the purpose of life and what makes life worth living impose constraints on a narrative construal of the meaning of life.

Furthermore, the ideas of purpose and value are themselves commonly understood to be forms of meaning. Goldman acknowledges meaning as purpose, but accords it a secondary status that is seemingly at odds not only with its primary place in a theistic narrative (and with his own account of meaning as narrative in which a narrative is about seeking to fulfill purposes rooted in desires), but also with the thought of most people. As Susan Wolf points out: "Though there may be many things going on when people ask, 'What is the meaning of life?', the most central among them seems to be a search to find a purpose . . . to human existence."[1] With regard to meaning as value, there is good reason to question Goldman's statement that the claim "that a meaningful life is simply a valuable life . . . does not seem to capture any ordinary sense of meaning" (2). Will Durant once queried Bertrand Russell "What is the meaning or worth of human life?"[2], and more recently Julian Baggini has defended the view that "what it's all about" is a life worth living in itself.[3] These points about meaning as purpose and value are a reminder that a narrative must narrate something, and many theists maintain a divine narrative narrates meaning as the purpose of life and meaning as what makes life worth living.

There is good reason to believe that a divine narrative narrates one other form of meaning. To understand what it is, consider Goldman's recognition that well-being can conflict with acting morally. That is, "immoral actions . . . can preserve or enhance personal welfare or well-being" (110) with few or no serious repercussions for the one acting immorally,

although most clever scoundrels are eventually found out and suffer the consequences, it is unfortunately naïve to think this is true of all. . . . I suspect that many of us personally know of only slightly less villainous characters who led lives full of pleasure . . . and know of good people who suffer disasters. (109-10)

When this happens, things ultimately do not fit together in the right way; they ultimately do not make sense, which concerns meaning as intelligibility. The theists mentioned above who maintain that the divine purpose for us is that we experience perfect happiness believe this purpose shapes God's narrative so that things ultimately make sense. Thus, meaning as intelligibility, like meaning as purpose and value, constrains the divine narrative.

Goldman briefly mentions nonsense or senselessness in relationship to meaning. He claims that while unhappiness, pain, and deprivation are the negative counterparts respectively to happiness, pleasure, and well-being, nonsense and senselessness are not negative counterparts to meaning. "They signify only lack of meaning, while pain is not simply the lack of pleasure, and similarly for unhappiness and deprivation" (116). But senselessness (not making sense) in the case of life's meaning seems to be more than the lack of meaning. If pain and pleasure are respectively negative and positive counterparts, it seems reasonable to hold that the negative counterpart to the positive good that is people experiencing deserved pleasure is good people experiencing undeserved pain. Meaninglessness as senselessness (a lack of fit) seems to be more than a lack of meaning.

In conclusion, not only is meaning pluralism more plausible than meaning monism,[4] but also some forms of meaning reasonably constrain others. Goldman's claim that meaning as narrative is the primary sense of meaning is suspect. While there is no need to deny that meaning as narrative is a legitimate form of meaning, there is good reason to maintain that it is a higher-order form of meaning relative to meaning as purpose, value, and intelligibility. Once the different forms of meaning are recognized and properly ordered, it becomes clear why, contrary to what Goldman claims, "the newer question of meaning in life [does not] assuage the worries that prompt the older question of the meaning of life" (121). The newer question of meaning in life fails to recognize and adequately address, as the older question of the meaning of life sought to do, meaning in the forms of ultimate purpose, value, and intelligibility.

[1] Susan Wolf, "The Meaning of Lives," in Exploring the Meaning of Life, edited by Joshua Seachris (Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell, 2013), pp. 304-5.

[2] Bertrand Russell, Bertrand Russell: Autobiography (London: Routledge, 2000), p. 443.

[3] Julian Baggini, What's It All About? Philosophy and the Meaning of Life (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2004).

[4] T. J. Mawson, God and the Meanings of Life (London: Bloomsbury, 2016).