Like-Minded: Externalism and Moral Psychology

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Andrew Sneddon, Like-Minded: Externalism and Moral Psychology, The MIT Press, 2011, 282pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262016117.

Reviewed by Jada Twedt Strabbing, Fordham University


What are the psychological foundations of morality? Are they emotional, as Hume claims? Or are they rational, as Kant claims? In Like-Minded: Externalism and Moral Psychology, Andrew Sneddon claims that Hume and Kant are both partly correct, but neither grasps the truth. The psychological foundations of morality, Sneddon proposes, are those capacities, including emotional and reasoning capacities, that enable us to participate in "wide" cognitive systems -- that is, cognitive systems that extend beyond the boundaries of individual agents. He calls this the Wide Moral Systems Hypothesis (WMSH).

The WMSH is a specific application of externalism in the sense of the Extended Mind Hypothesis. According to this view, at least some cognitive processes extend beyond the boundaries of individuals to include worldly resources. These worldly resources are not merely inputs to cognitive processes, as individualists suppose, but actually partially constitute them. To illustrate, individualists would suppose that the moral judgments of others simply serve as inputs to our capacity to make moral judgments. However, on Sneddon's view, the moral judgments of others partially constitute our capacity to make moral judgments. In fact, he argues that we are under intense pressure to conform our views to those around us, and so interpersonal resources are the worldly resources that partially constitute our moral psychology. This makes us literally like-minded: we share the psychological processes central to morality with other people. As Sneddon puts it, "We think the same partly because it is prudent and partly because we use the same token systems to think." (23)

To demonstrate the plausibility of the WMSH, Sneddon evaluates wide hypotheses for four distinct aspects of our moral psychology: 1) moral judgment, 2) moral reasoning, 3) moral responsibility attributions, and 4) action production. Before turning to these specific hypotheses, he spends Chapter 1 laying the necessary groundwork. He first situates his version of externalism against others. Most notably, he claims that at least some of the bearers of psychological content extend beyond the boundaries of individuals. This is distinct from content externalism, which claims that the content of psychological states depends upon the environment. Hence you will not find any arguments about Twin Earth in the book. Sneddon then tells us when we should prefer an externalist to an individualist hypothesis. This is essential to evaluating the above four wide hypotheses. His contention is that "Externalist hypotheses are warranted for any psychological phenomenon that exhibits systematic individual-environment relations." (7) He then presents a schema to tell us when we have an individual-environment system. Roughly, there must be a sufficient degree of causal and functional integration between the individual and the environment, and the purported system must play a replicable causal role in some phenomenon.

Before turning to subsequent chapters, it is worth mentioning that Sneddon does not argue for the Extended Mind Hypothesis and so does not argue for the above schema that arises from it either. He leaves that task to others, and his purpose is only to show that the Extended Mind Hypothesis can plausibly explain central aspects of our moral psychology. Thus his arguments for the WMSH will likely not be convincing to those who do not already place some stock in externalism. Yet, if his arguments are successful, this may still constitute indirect support for that hypothesis.

In Chapter 2, Sneddon develops the WMSH by focusing on the capacity to make moral judgments,[1] arguing that this capacity is plural, hybrid, and embedded. It is plural in that emotion, reason, and other psychological phenomena can produce moral judgments. Thus, he claims, Hume and Kant can both be correct about the psychological foundations of morality. In arguing this, he uses the work of Shaun Nichols, Marc Hauser, Jesse Prinz, and Jonathan Haidt as foils, as they each hold that the mechanisms of moral judgment have a unified psychological core. The capacity to make moral judgments is hybrid in that it extends into the world to include interpersonal resources in systematic ways. This is the externalist theme of the chapter. One person's emotion or moral judgment can, he claims, partially constitute another person's capacity to make moral judgments. Finally, the mechanisms of moral judgment are embedded in that they partially constitute other psychological capacities, most notably moral reasoning capacities.

Sneddon's aim in Chapter 3 is to argue for externalism about moral reasoning. According to this view, "moral reasoning centrally and literally (but not solely) takes place between people." (71) It does so because, like the capacity to make moral judgments, it draws on interpersonal resources in such a way that the individual forms a wide system with others. In the case of moral reasoning, the wide system plays a replicable causal role in social influence.

In Chapter 4, Sneddon argues that at least some of the capacities by which we attribute moral responsibility are plural and wide. He does so by arguing against what he calls The Tempting View. According to the Tempting View, having reactive attitudes -- such as resentment, indignation, and gratitude -- toward others is both necessary and sufficient to attribute responsibility to them. Sneddon denies both the necessity and sufficiency claim. Instead, he argues, we attribute moral responsibility in many different ways, using diverse psychological capacities, some of which are wide. In particular, attributing responsibility requires the ability to understand the thoughts of others ("mind-reading"), which is a wide capacity.

In Chapter 5, Sneddon argues for externalism with respect to action production. He does so by appealing to situationism: a view in psychology according to which context or environment plays a substantial role in determining our behavior. Sneddon argues that situationism implies that beliefs, desires, and other pro-attitudes do not alone produce action. Instead, he claims that situationism supports externalism about the mechanisms of action production, since it gives us good reason to posit a high degree of causal and functional integration between the individual and his environment. Sneddon then proposes an externalist account of action production based on a model by the psychologists Yuichi Shoda and Walter Mischel. On this model, cognitive and affective units that exhibit stable "if-then situation-behavior relations" produce action. These units, on Sneddon's view, are not located solely within the physical boundaries of the agent.

Chapters 2-5 complete the argument for the WMSH. In them, Sneddon has argued that the above four constituents of our moral psychology should be understood as extending beyond the boundaries of individual agents. In the sixth and final chapter, Sneddon focuses on a theme that has been in the background: the heterogeneity of moral psychology. He illustrates the extent of this heterogeneity by examining the many different kinds of amoralism. Yet although he focuses on pluralism, externalism is not relegated to the background for long. Sneddon appeals to the latter to explain the former: "our moral minds are psychologically heterogeneous in part because they are significantly widely realized and the world in which we operate is heterogeneous." (204) Sneddon concludes the chapter by discussing some practical implications of both the externalism and pluralism of the WMSH, focusing on moral education, autism, and psychopathy. For example, autistic people have difficulty understanding the thoughts of others, and this means that they cannot participate in wide systems. The upshot is that, according to the WMSH, they are literally cut off from a part of their own minds. This brings potentially unexpected therapeutic challenges.

Sneddon provides good reasons to think that the Extended Mind Hypothesis can be extended to the psychological foundations of morality. However, I worry that even if we grant his arguments for the WMSH, they do not prove as much as he supposes with respect to issues in moral psychology. There are three main instances of this.

The first instance is in his discussion of our capacities for moral judgment. After arguing that these capacities are fundamentally plural, he claims that this shows that Hume and Kant are each partly correct in their views of the psychological foundations of morality, although neither grasps the whole truth. However, this does not follow. The debate between cognitivists like Kant and non-cognitivists like Hume is not about whether our capacities to make moral judgments are reasoning capacities or emotional capacities. Rather, it is about whether moral judgments themselves -- the outputs of these capacities -- are cognitive states like beliefs or non-cognitive states like desires. If they are cognitive states, then this counts in favor of moral realism. If they are non-cognitive states, then this counts against moral realism. Of course, it seems natural to think that reasoning capacities produce cognitive states and emotional capacities produce non-cognitive states, but this need not be the case. For example, it is plausible that our emotional capacities can produce beliefs. Consider wishful thinking: we come to believe something that we have no reason to believe because we so badly want it to be true. Or consider beliefs that arise from depression: we come to believe something negative -- e.g., that no one cares about us -- in spite of substantial evidence to the contrary. Although this is more controversial, it may also be possible for our reasoning capacities to give rise to desires. So Sneddon is not actually taking a stand on the debate between Hume and Kant, as he thinks. Even if the underlying mechanisms of moral judgment are plural, moral judgments themselves may all be cognitive states, like Kant thinks, or may all be non-cognitive states, like Hume thinks. Further argument is required to show that the various mechanisms that produce moral judgments do so by giving rise to various kinds of psychological states, all of which are moral judgments.

The second overreaching problem occurs in Sneddon's chapter on moral responsibility attributions. His target is the Tempting View, which says that reactive attitudes are both necessary and sufficient for moral responsibility attributions. He rejects the sufficiency condition by rejecting the view of the mind upon which the Tempting View is supposedly based. This is the view of the mind as vertically modular: perceptual systems provide input, action systems provide output, and higher cognition mediates between these. Why does Sneddon claim that the Tempting View is based upon this vertically modular view of the mind? His reasoning takes two steps. First, he claims that the Tempting View entails that the ways in which we express reactive attitudes are constitutively distinct from the reactive attitudes themselves. Second, he claims that this is what we would expect if we take emotions -- like reactive attitudes -- to be perceptual capacities which serve as input to higher cognition, as on the vertically modular view of the mind.

However, even if we grant that Sneddon's argument against the vertically modular view of the mind is successful, he is wrong to think that it undermines the sufficiency condition of the Tempting View. To see this, let's examine his proposed counterexample to the sufficiency condition. Sneddon claims that the falsity of the vertically modular view of the mind would show that reactive attitudes are not constitutively distinct from their expressions. The upshot, he says, would be that "some instances of feelings alone suffice for attributions of responsibility but others do not since these others are not constitutively distinct from their expression." (140) Thus, his proposed counterexample to the sufficiency condition is a case in which someone feels a reactive attitude that is not constitutively distinct from its expression and attributes responsibility. However, this is not actually a counterexample. To undermine the sufficiency condition, we need a case in which someone feels a reactive attitude but does not attribute responsibility. After all, in the case that Sneddon gives, the fact that someone feels a reactive attitude could still be sufficient for him to attribute responsibility. The fact that the reactive attitude is not constitutively distinct from its expression would then be beside the point as far as the responsibility attribution goes. The failure of Sneddon's argument lies in the first step of his reasoning. Contra his supposition, the Tempting View could still be correct even if reactive attitudes are not constitutively distinct from their expressions because the Tempting View does not commit itself to a particular view of reactive attitudes. It is broad enough to encompass the view that reactive attitudes are partially constituted by their expressions. Hence Sneddon incorrectly takes his target to be the Tempting View rather than a particular view of emotions based upon the vertically modular view of the mind.

The third overreaching problem arises in the context of Sneddon's discussion of action production. He says that situationism shows that we need to revise familiar philosophical schemas of action production. In particular, he claims,

situationism does not imply that beliefs, desires, and other pro-attitudes do not produce actions, but it does imply that they alone do not produce actions. The reasonable way to account for widespread behavioral inconsistency is . . . simply to add other things to the list of psychological contributors to the production of action. (186, emphasis his)

However, situationism does not have that upshot. Even if environmental and contextual factors influence our actions to the extent that situationism claims, they could do so by affecting our beliefs and desires, which in turn produce our action. Thus, situationism is compatible with the Humean View of action -- the idea that beliefs and desires are the only psychological contributors to action production. In particular, the two views are compatible because the Humean View is not committed to our having personality traits which operate in regular ways independent of context. It can allow for widespread behavioral inconsistency that can only be explained by the influence of the agent's context. Hence, without further argument, situationism need not require us to revise standard philosophical schemas of action production, although it might have important upshots for the contents of beliefs and desires.

Sneddon's arguments show less than he supposes regarding these three issues, but there are still important issues at stake. For example, is our capacity to make moral judgments psychologically unified or plural? This is an important question even if it does not have a direct upshot for the debate between Hume and Kant, and Sneddon provides an excellent discussion and critique of the main unity theories and puts forward his own pluralist view. Further, although the sufficiency condition of the Tempting View is not at stake, Sneddon's discussion of the nature of the mind, and of emotions in particular, is fascinating. He draws on empirical studies to cast doubt upon the vertically modular view of the mind and the view of emotions as perceptual capacities. Finally, even though situationism does not refute the Humean view of action, Sneddon effectively draws upon empirical studies to illuminate the psychological basis of action production.

In sum, although Sneddon's arguments do not prove as much as he supposes regarding debates in moral psychology, he does show that externalism has the resources to explain central elements of our moral psychology. This is a valuable contribution, especially for those who find the Extended Mind Hypothesis plausible. He also brings fascinating empirical research into his discussions in effective ways. Those interested in either the Extended Mind Hypothesis or in the contribution that empirical work can make to our understanding of the psychological foundations of morality will find much to like in Like-Minded.

[1] Sneddon uses "moral judgment" to mean the capacity by which we morally evaluate actions, states of affairs, and people, rather than the output of that capacity. To avoid ambiguity, I will use "capacity for moral judgment" to refer to the former and "moral judgment" to refer to the latter.