Likeness and Likelihood in the Presocratics and Plato

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Jenny Bryan, Likeness and Likelihood in the Presocratics and Plato, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 210pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521762946.

Reviewed by John Palmer, University of Florida


Xenophanes says his teachings should be regarded as "like the truth"; Parmenides more obscurely describes his cosmology as possessing some sort of likelihood; and, most famously, Plato in the Timaeus qualifies his cosmological account as a "likely story." This revised version of its author's Cambridge doctoral thesis offers a detailed, largely philological exploration of how the notion of likelihood figures in each of these contexts and offers a developmental account of the allusive means whereby these philosophers may have been engaging with their predecessors' deployment of the notion (these being, in Xenophanes' case, Homer and Hesiod).

Chapter 1, "Xenophanes' fallibilism," provides a word-by-word discussion of Xenophanes 21B35 D-K, ταῦτα δεδοξάσθαι μὲν ἐοικότα τοῖς ἐτύμοισι. Bryan considers the fragment both against the background of truth claims in Homeric-Hesiodic epic and within the context of the stretch of Plutarch's Quaestiones Convivales in which it is transmitted. She eventually decides that the fragment can be understood either as an exhortation to Xenophanes' audience ("Let these [teachings] be believed to be like the truth") or as Xenophanes' own classificatory comment ("These [teachings] have been believed to be like the truth"). Whether Xenophanes' teachings should be or have been regarded as ἐοικότα τοῖς ἐτύμοισι or "like the truth," the implication in either case is that they may prove false albeit worthy of belief until they do so. To reach this conclusion Bryan focuses at some length on the semantic distinction between ὁμοῖος and ἐοικώς in the Iliad and Odyssey and in Xenophanes himself. She argues that he deliberately manipulates the epic formula ἐτύμοισι ὁμοῖα, used to mark falsehoods as indistinguishable from the truth, so as to mark his own account as having an apparent but potentially specious similarity to truth. This reading of B35 as containing a warning as well as a qualified endorsement is in line with the more overt epistemological pessimism of B34, where Xenophanes states that no man has seen the clear truth nor will ever have knowledge regarding the gods and all the things of which he speaks and so declares that everyone possesses mere opinion (δόκος). The upshot is a fresh version of the common "fallibilist" interpretation of Xenophanes' epistemology, according to which, as Bryan puts it, "Xenophanes is urging us to believe his account to be possibly but uncertainly true. . . . [He is] not calling his doctrines untrue, but he is admitting that they could be" (46). A virtue of her systematic analysis of the distinction of ὁμοῖος vs. ἐοικώς is that it provides a counter to the main objection leveled by James Lesher against previous fallibilist interpretations in his edition's survey of modern scholarship's differing views on Xenophanes' epistemology, namely, that "it is not obvious how or where the ideas of fallibility and a perpetual possibility of error are to be found in fragment 34" (Xenophanes of Colophon, Toronto 1992). Bryan shows that these notions come into play with Xenophanes' deliberate description of his teachings as ἐοικότα ἐτύμοισι.

Chapter 2, "Parmenides' allusive ambiguity," focuses on the sense of ἐοικώς in the phrase διάκοσμον ἐοικότα πάντα (28B8.60 D-K) that marks the status of the ensuing cosmological portion of the poem at the end of the trustworthy account regarding true reality. Bryan tries to explain the sense of what is for her the key term while generally steering clear of the poem's major interpretative problems. She thus classifies and reviews four principal renderings of ἐοικώς here in B8.60: (1) "similar," (2) "fitting" or "appropriate," (3) "specious," and (4) "plausible." Instead of rejecting any of these outright, she proposes that Parmenides is being deliberately ambiguous or even equivocal. She reads ἐοικώς as incorporating the rhetorical sense "plausible" on the grounds that several terms in the fragments -- σήματα, κρίσις, δίκη, ἔλεγχος, and πίστις -- have forensic overtones. On the grounds that Parmenides B8.60 purportedly omits τοῖς ἐτύμοισι while alluding to Xenophanes B35, she reads ἐοικώς as indicating that his account does not possess the similarity to truth Xenophanes had claimed for his teachings.

The basic problem with Bryan's approach in this chapter is that understanding the meaning of ἐοικότα πάντα at B8.60 ultimately requires taking a stance on the major issues pertaining to the status of the cosmology. Because she does not directly address these larger issues, Bryan is in no good position to sort out the various possibilities regarding the sense of ἐοικώς here. She tries to make a virtue of this situation by claiming that Parmenides' use of the term is deliberately ambiguous, such that it has something of all the senses it has been taken to have on the competing and, significantly, incompatible interpretations of the cosmology's status. The best part of this chapter is Bryan's comparative treatment of Parmenides and Xenophanes' epistemology in a section toward the end entitled "Corrective epistemology." Here she properly characterizes Parmenides' greater epistemic optimism as extending to mortals the possibility of achieving certainty "if they focus their reasoning on the nature of what is and cannot not be (B2.3)" while at the same time recognizing their tendency "to stray onto the wrong path, populated as it is by unsuitable objects of cognition (B8.38-41; 53-59)" (101). She then has interesting things to say about the consequences of the fundamental contrast between Parmenides and Xenophanes' epistemologies as, respectively, object-centered and subject-centered. Because she here begins to take stances on the most relevant issues, this section provides the most useful material in the chapter for beginning to understand the relation between Parmenides B8.60 and Xenophanes B35. But it is only a beginning. If Bryan had pursued the issues here more assiduously, she might have appreciated that Parmenides does not mean his cosmology to be regarded as false merely because it describes things that are generated and change rather than what is and cannot not be.

Chapter 3, "Plato's Timaeus," focuses on Timaeus's claim that an account of an εἰκών or "likeness" must be εἰκώς or "likely" given the general relation he says should obtain between the status of accounts and their subject-matter. Bryan proposes that this claim points to "the need to describe a likeness as a likeness" by means of an account that expresses "the nature of its descriptum as an εἰκών" (158). The point is that an εἰκώς account of an εἰκών will describe that likeness in a manner that emphasizes its relation to its model. Since the cosmos is on Plato's view modeled on the intelligible realm, any adequate cosmology needs to demonstrate how the cosmos relates to its model. Bryan presents her reading as an alternative to those that take Timaeus to be signaling some sort of deficiency or lack of certainty in the account to come. She follows Myles Burnyeat ("Eikōs muthos," Rhizai, 2 [2005], 143-65) in stressing that Timaeus's proemium is prescriptive rather than descriptive, but her emphasis on the need to explain the figura etymologica according to which an account of an εἰκών must itself be εἰκώς leads her to resist his understanding of εἰκώς as 'reasonable', in the sense that it demonstrates the reasonableness of the Demiurge's decisions in creating the world. Bryan's understanding of εἰκώς largely steers clear of the epistemological overtones Burnyeat and most others hear in Timaeus's description of his cosmology as an εἰκὼς μῦθος or "likely story." On her reading, εἰκώς means not so much "likely" as "appropriate for a likeness." To the worry that one will be hard pressed to find εἰκώς elsewhere used in this sense, Bryan's reply will be that the semantic connection with εἰκών informs its meaning in this particular context. Although she maintains that it is compatible with the more typical understanding of εἰκώς as "plausible," the sense she advocates not surprisingly does most of the work as she further develops her reading of Timaeus's proemium.

Chapter 4, "Imitation and limitation in Timaeus' Proemium," first argues that there is a corrective allusion to Parmenides in Timaeus's analogy οὐσία : γένεσις :: ἀλήθεια : πίστις (Ti. 29c2-c3). Taking as obvious Parmenides and Plato's "shared distinction between Being as the object of νόησις and Coming-to-be as the object of δόξα" (164), she again follows Burnyeat in seeing Plato as subverting Parmenides B1.29-30, with its assertion that there is no πίστις ἀληθής in the cosmology (cf. Burnyeat 2005, 153). She departs from Burnyeat in suggesting that πίστις is not the cognitive state of conviction but the quality of convincingness that accrues to the best accounts of coming-to-be. By drawing upon her explanation of how Timaeus's cosmology is a "likely" account of a likeness, she almost makes the point that needs to be made here, namely, that Plato finds the measure of stability in the cosmos's created and mutable entities that is required to give his cosmology its corresponding measure of conviction by regarding them as imitations of uncreated and immutable reality. Plato here as elsewhere holds that there is no knowledge of perceptibles as such but only insofar as they may be regarded as reflecting or instantiating the stable entities that are the proper objects of knowledge (cf. Ti. 27d-28a). Given the various echoes of Parmenides' account of What Is in his own cosmology, it remains an open question whether Plato actually means to criticize him, as Bryan claims, on the grounds that "since Coming-to-be is modeled on Being, it is fundamentally influenced by the nature of Being" such that "accounts of Coming-to-be will not be devoid of any kind of truth whatsoever" (174). It also remains a problem for Bryan's view that Parmenides nowhere says there is no πίστις whatsoever to be had in cosmology but just none of the πίστις ἀληθής that comes from focusing one's reasoning on the nature of what is and cannot not be. On this point he and Plato are agreed.

Finally in this chapter Bryan addresses Timaeus's remarks at the end of his proemium (Ti. 29c4-d3) that his inability to produce accounts completely consistent and accurate in every detail should be tolerated so long as they are sufficiently likely and that, since he himself is merely human, it is therefore fitting to rest content with the εἰκὼς μῦθος or "likely story." Since on her view the need to give an εἰκώς account of an εἰκών is a necessary condition of a successful account and as such does not restrict its potential accuracy, she assigns the limitations Timaeus speaks of to the term μῦθος. She draws upon the contrasts between εἰκὼς μῦθος and εἰκὼς λόγος and between human and divine abilities at certain points in the subsequent discussion (Ti. 68b-d, 72d, and to some extent 59c-d) to suggest that, according to Timaeus, in the field of cosmology the best representative accounts humans can produce must remain unverifiable by their direct experience. This reading provides her with the link to Xenophanes' qualification of his teachings as ἐοικότα τοῖς ἐτύμοισι that rounds off her own story. Here, too, she sees Plato offering a correction to the standpoint of a predecessor with whom he is otherwise sympathetic. Although Bryan takes Plato to agree with Xenophanes that our limited cognitive capacities as humans means that our accounts may aspire at best to the status of necessarily uncertain candidates for truth, she also wants to stresses that since humans, according to the Timaeus, share to some extent in the rational nature of the divine, "there is a strong ethical impetus . . . to strive to be like god and, after all, to search for something more than uncertain μῦθος" (189-90).

Unfortunately, Bryan simply leaves it at that. Here the obvious point is that Plato's effort to envision the kind of reasoning that drove the Demiurge to create the cosmos in just the way he did represents his own effort to achieve the understanding of the world and its workings that might otherwise be regarded as God's exclusive province. In this respect the Timaeus's cosmology, particularly its account of the works of reason, stands in stark contrast to the retreat by the Phaedo's Socrates from the prospect of trying to provide properly teleological explanations of natural phenomena. The guiding principles of explanation in the Timaeus becomes God's own goodness, his concomitant desire that all things should be as like him, i.e., as good as possible, and his awareness that order and harmony are better than disorder and lack of harmony (Ti. 29d-30a). It is one of the virtues of Bryan's reading of the perennially puzzling phrase εἰκὼς μῦθος that it points to what proves to be an essential feature of Timaeus's cosmology. One hopes that she will extend the scope of her discussion in the future to say more on the subject of how its initially inharmonious and disorderly motion being endowed with order and harmony by the Demiurge makes this cosmos a likeness of what is uncreated, unchanging, and divine. Although Bryan leaves one wanting more and advocates certain views sure to occasion disagreement, she has nonetheless produced a solid study of an important and heretofore inadequately explored set of connections between Plato, Parmenides, and Xenophanes that will be indispensible for future discussion of the issues.