Linguistic Content: New Essays on the History of Philosophy of Language

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Margaret Cameron and Robert J. Stainton (eds.), Linguistic Content: New Essays on the History of Philosophy of Language, Oxford University Press, 2015, 272pp., $66.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198732495.

Reviewed by Walter Ott, University of Virginia


Margaret Cameron and Robert Stainton's welcome anthology 'treats linguistic content across the history of Western philosophy of language, from Plato through Brentano's student Marty' (1). The book is organized around two questions:

Q1:  What varieties of linguistic content did the author or period countenance?

Q2:  What metaphysical groundings for linguistic content were considered? (1)

The volume opens with Deborah Modrak's essay on Plato's theory of definition, which is a useful tour through the dialogues' methods and assumptions. Modrak argues that Plato is tacitly committed to a two-tiered account of definition and, by extension, reference. At the first tier are 'names and senses as expressed in linguistic definitions and the referents of words' (16). At the second, we find the same names and their true definitions. The second-tier primary referents of these names are the Forms, whereas their secondary referents are ordinary objects. Although prima facie plausible, this interpretation seems hard to ground in the texts. Most obviously, one wonders whether Plato would welcome the Fregean terminology of sense and reference or the distinction between primary and secondary referents.

Francesco Ademollo's 'Names, Verbs, and Sentences in Ancient Greek Philosophy' focuses on two questions. First, what exactly is the distinction the ancients draw between onomata and rhemata? Ademollo argues that in Plato's Cratylus (though not necessarily in other dialogues) onomata are names, whereas rhemata are verbs (36). This contrasts with other readings, which take onomata to be subjects or names and rhemata to be predicates. If Ademollo is right, Plato's usage in the Cratylus anticipates Aristotle's in De Interpretatione. Ademollo's second question concerns sentence signification: is a sentence a name, or not? On Plato's view, a sentence is not a name, but for the Stoics, inspired perhaps by Aristotle's notion of pragma, sentences name states of affairs.

The question of the signification of the sentence continues to occupy medieval thinkers, as Margaret Cameron shows in her especially clear and useful contribution. Cameron focuses on Abelard and the Stoics, noting that, although there is no evidence the Stoics influenced Abelard, they arrive at similar positions and for similar reasons. Both are 'anti-realists' who want to introduce the notion of a proposition in pursuit of a deflationary metaphysics. Both analyze away categorical statements ('dogs are mammals') as disguised conditionals ('if something is a dog, it is a mammal'). In the case of the Stoics, this allows them to do away with general concepts (61). For his part, Abelard has no problem with concepts, which makes one wonder why the Stoics would think that merely going conditional would 'remove any reference to a generic object' (61). Most interesting is the peculiar ontological status propositions are supposed to have. For the Stoics, lekta are not bodies, and since only bodies exist, on their view, lekta at most 'subsist'. For Abelard, a dictum is a 'quasi-thing of the proposition' (69). Abelard and the Stoics both argue for the need to posit 'the sayable' as something more than tokens of sounds or marks on a page even as they try to keep their metaphysics as lean as possible.

Peter Adamson and Alexander Key's focus is the medieval Arabic tradition They present their chapter as describing the clash between the 'autochthonous and pre-existing Arabic bipartite theory of meaning' and the Aristotelian tripartite theory, which arrives on the Arab scene in the seventh century. The bipartite Arab theory countenances vocal form and mental content only, while the Aristotelian view adds a third element: the object in the world. The set-up is a bit odd. As Adamson and Key point out, the two traditions are only superficially incompatible (74). (Only idealists would insist on the absence of the third member of the tripartite view.) In fact, most of the chapter concerns a debate in the tenth century between the Arab grammarian Abū Sa‘īd al-Sīrāfī and a defender of the interloping Greek discipline of logic, Abū Bishr Mattā. What is at stake is, among other things, whether logic is indeed universal or contingent on the particular features of the Greek language (79). Avicenna ultimately achieves a rapprochement by confining logic to the syllogism, definition, and description, leaving 'room for the autochthonous linguistic sciences' of the Arabic tradition (94).

Joke Spruyt and Catarina Dutilh Novaes provide an informative treatment of medieval theories of syncategoremata. Focusing on the thirteenth and fourteenth centuries, they aim to contrast medieval treatments with contemporary views on the logical constants. As they note, medieval syncategoremata include more than the logical constants; at times, the category seems to be a grab bag of everything that is neither subject nor predicate. Where the constants are concerned, the medievals are said to share with Dummett and Davidson a concern for the 'significatio/meaning' of the logical constants. It is hard to evaluate this claim without knowing what Spruyt and Novaes think "significatio" and "meaning" mean. In any case, the dissimilarities are more instructive. The authors note that the medievals, unlike some contemporary philosophers, do not see the categoremata/syncategoremata distinction as revealing anything about the scope of logic or the validity of arguments. Nor do they worry much about giving a precise demarcation of the class of syncategoremata. Spruyt and Novaes claim that this 'fluidity' 'may serve as inspiration for an open-ended conception of logical constants' (118).

Gyula Klima's ambitious 'Semantic Content in Aquinas and Ockham' uses historical figures to mount a philosophical argument. In brief, Klima's thesis is that any position on the identity of concepts that allows for the Cartesian evil demon scenario (or the Putnamian brain in a vat scenario) must be false. Following Claude Pannacio, Klima argues that Ockham distinguishes between semantic content (what a term refers to) and phenomenal content (the set of phenomenal features one uses to recognize something as falling under a kind). For Ockham, semantic content is fixed by causation, whereas phenomenal content is just whatever phenomenal features the subject happens to pick up on.

Klima argues that Ockham's position entails a contradiction, for Ockham counts two concepts as the same just in case they have the same phenomenal content. But then Ockham has to say that we and an envatted person (call him 'Vatman') make the same judgment when we say that 'Vatman is a brain in a vat'. That judgment is true when we say it but false when Vatman says it because Vatman's concepts do not have the semantic content brain and vat. Contradiction.[1]

The way out of the contradiction (and out of the skeptical scenario) is hyper-externalism, which Klima, on the basis of nine quoted words, purports to find in Aquinas. On this view, the way concepts are identified 'has practically nothing to do with their internal or phenomenal properties' (131). Instead, it is constitutive of a concept that it carry or encode information. That, of course, sounds like cold comfort. Suppose I am Vatman and, as a result, I do not have the concepts <brain> and <vat>, but some other concepts. But this just pushes the question back: instead of 'am I a brain in a vat?' I have to ask, 'what concepts do I have?' And nothing about their phenomenal features can answer this question.

To this, Klima replies by shifting analogies. He says that

even if a recorded TV programme could not be distinguished from the live feed of the same by just looking at the screen, the two are not the same, and their difference is detectable precisely by looking at the process of the transfer of information producing the exact same looking, but essentially different, images on the screen (130).

But the cases are importantly disanalogous. In the TV case, we have access to the origin of the signal independently of what image is presented on the screen: we can go and look at the process that produced it. In the case of perception, there is only the screen. Whatever one makes of Klima's arguments, the paper is a stimulating and intriguing contribution.

Lodi Nauta's excellent paper on the Renaissance humanist Lorenzo Valla announces a theme of the later entries in the anthology: the degree to which historical figures anticipate twentieth century developments, especially (for reasons I find totally obscure) ordinary language philosophy and Wittgensteinian meaning-as-use theories. As Nauta presents him, Valla is important for his contribution to the 'growing awareness' that language can influence thought. But Nauta convincingly deflates the claims of other scholars. In particular, he shows that Valla does not conflate words and things, does not define meaning as use, and is not an ordinary language philosopher. The last claim is a bit odd in any case, given that the language Valla lauds is not the vernacular of his day but classical Latin (as opposed to the barbarous neologisms of the scholastics) (145). Nauta argues that Valla simply does not have any desire to map the 'logical geography' of concepts, nor does he purport to solve or dissolve philosophical problems by diagnosing category mistakes.

E. Jennifer Ashworth does a masterly job of canvassing medieval theories of signification, connecting much of her work over the last 35 years. Among the issues she covers are the origins of language, whether things or concepts are signified by words, and the nature of significatio. The title of her chapter, 'Medieval Theories of Signification to John Locke', is slightly misleading since we get only a handful of paragraphs about Locke. Her conclusions about Locke are modest: she claims that it 'makes sense to see Locke as standing in a long tradition' (173) of thinking about signification even if Locke 'very probably' didn't study the 'more sophisticated' discussions (172).

Benjamin Hill ('Locke on the Names of Modes') argues that, for Locke, 'certain kinds of naming literally create new thought' (199). In the case of modes, 'the name makes the idea possible' (200). This claim runs counter to the dominant reading of Locke, which takes ideas to be logically prior to language. Hill argues that modes are an exception. On Hill's reading, an idea of a mode is 'formulated by a linguistic act working in conjunction with an act of the understanding' (188).[2] To his credit, Hill recognizes the substantial textual evidence to the contrary. For example, Locke claims that there are ideas of modes that lack names (II.xvii.5-7); if so, no act of naming can be necessary for the construction of the idea. But Hill claims that the 'textual situation looks to be a wash', with evidence on both sides. Hill instead offers a theoretical, rather than textual, argument for his conclusion. If an idea of a mode is to be its own archetype and hence 'regulate predications' (192) it must persist 'for years and decades' (196). Moreover, the idea must be capable 'at least in principle, of being used by any number of thinkers' (194). Ideas fail both requirements since they are fleeting and 'purely subjective entities' (196). Language and naming, Hill concludes, have to be brought in as 'supports' for the idea. I confess I had a hard time seeing the evidence for these two requirements in Locke's talk of archetypes. One might also worry that Hill's conclusion can be accommodated by the more pedestrian reading of Locke. There is nothing mysterious in language acting as an aid to memory or helping to preserve the definitions of terms over time. None of that would show that language makes ideas possible rather than the other way around. Nevertheless, Hill's essay is an intriguing one philosophers will want to grapple with themselves.

Michael N. Forster's 'Herder's Doctrine of Meaning as Use' seeks not only to establish the precise form of Herder's theory of meaning but to contrast it with competing forms of use theories, such as those of Davidson and Wittgenstein. Unlike some later use theorists, Herder is an atomist, not a holist; it's the use of a single word, not its relation to all others, that constitutes its meaning. But Forster's Herder is also a 'quasi-empiricist' who thinks that 'meanings or concepts must of their very nature be anchored in perceptual or affective sensations' (218). This is true even of syncategoremata like 'not'. Forster suggests that when one sees a cat sitting on a chair and then sees it jump off, one has a 'sensory illustration' of 'not' (220). But at this point, I begin to lose my grip on what Herder's alleged use theory is supposed to amount to: it seems to collapse into a version of the traditional tripartite (word, mental stuff, thing) Aristotelian view. Indeed, some of the texts Forster adduces to show that Herder holds that meaning is use seem susceptible to the kind of deflationary treatment we see Nauta apply to Valla.[3] Still, Forster's wide-ranging essay contains some intriguing arguments against later forms of the meaning-is-use position.

In addition to its substantive development of its subject's views, Patrick Rysiew's 'Thomas Reid on Language' mounts an effective attack on those who would recruit Reid into the ranks of ordinary language philosophers. Like Nauta, Rysiew does a fine job taking the air out of the hyperbolic bloviations that surround his chosen figure. (At this point in the volume, the reader begins to wonder whether there is any figure in the history of philosophy who hasn't been claimed as the anticipator of some recent trend or other. How long before Plotinus starts doing X-phi?)

Perhaps the most intriguing feature of Reid's view is his position on what can be taken as primitive and what needs philosophical explanation. Reid criticizes Locke's and Berkeley's explanations of the signification of general terms only to declare that their mistake was to try to explain one of our fundamental cognitive abilities at all (238). And among our fundamental abilities are social acts, such as asking and answering questions (239).

In the final chapter, Laurent Cesalli discusses Anton Marty's 'Pragmatic Semantics'. One of Brentano's first pupils, Marty uses his teacher's broadly scholastic set of terms and notions. Marty develops a twofold picture of language: words are aimed at indicating the speaker's 'mental life' and, at the same time, at 'triggering corresponding mental states in the hearer' (254). Although Cesalli doesn't make the connection, this part of Marty's view fits with a tradition that runs from Aristotle and Sextus Empiricus to Locke and Berkeley, namely, treating signification as indication. (In this volume, only Ashworth discusses this tradition, on 161.) Cesalli concludes by claiming that, although 'the reception of Marty's Sprachphilosophie was not exactly a spectacular one', he did exercise some influence on the Linguistic Circle of Prague. More broadly, Cesalli claims that Marty's work is of interest because it 'presents remarkable similarities with Grice's intentionalist semantics' and with the meaning-as-use doctrine (262). But once again, the rush to find points of similarity with twentieth century claims strikes me as a distraction and a cause of distortion.

In general, one comes away from the volume struck by the sheer diversity of views, motivations, and programs over the centuries. Correspondingly, of course, there is the danger of anachronism: we cannot assume that views that rose to prominence only in the last hundred years or so can be read back into historical figures. Some of the essays take this danger as their explicit theme; others, unfortunately, fall victim to it.

I should mention one last feature that will vex some readers. Central terms, such as 'meaning', 'signification', 'sense', and even 'linguistic content' itself, are too rarely defined. Such terms are often (and in some cases only) philosophical terms of art and not the pre-theoretical common property of all competent speakers. Lacking a definition of these terms, it is impossible to tell whether two authors really disagree. When Locke says that words 'properly and immediately signify nothing but Ideas, that are in the Mind of the Speaker' (Essay III.ii.4), is he saying something Reid, or Aristotle, or Herder would object to? The irony, of course, is that Locke, Reid, and others are concerned with language partly because they want to warn against just this predicament.

However that may be, I recommend this volume and hope that it will spur further research into what has been, until very recently, the invisible history of the philosophy language.

1] One might wonder whether Ockham would accept that there is a contradiction here. For Klima's Ockham, two judgments are the same just in case the phenomenal contents of the concepts are the same; same judgment, same truth value, regardless of what the concepts refer to. But if that is Ockham's view, he has bigger problems than Descartes's demon. Surely the extensions of the terms -- the semantic content -- are relevant to truth values. When Vatman and I say 'Vatman is a brain in a vat', we are talking about totally different things (brains and vats in my case; whatever causes certain of Vatman's experiences in his case). As a result, the judgments Vatman and I make do not contradict each other anymore than the judgments of two people who assert and deny, respectively, the sentence 'I washed my car yesterday'.

[2] This is only one of four claims made by Hill's linguistic reading, but it is 'the central one, and the others follow from it as corollaries' (188).

[3] For instance, one text Forster adduces (twice: 201, 205) is from Herder's On Diligence in Several Learned Languages (1764): 'Whoever learns to express himself with exactness precisely thereby gathers for himself a treasure of determinate concepts. The first words that we mumble are the most important foundation stones of the understanding'.