Linguistic Turns in Modern Philosophy

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Michael Losonsky, Linguistic Turns in Modern Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 294pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 052165470X.

Reviewed by Michael Ayers, Oxford University


Linguistic Turns in Modern Philosophy, a contribution to the series 'The Evolution of Modern Philosophy', is a consciously selective history of modern philosophy of natural language from Locke to Davidson and Derrida -- a necessarily abbreviated explanatory record of how we have got where we are. Losonsky's strategy is to pick on a number of 'landmark' theories, which are expounded and then set into their historical contexts of antecedents, reactions and developments. The main players discussed and contextualized are Locke, Leibniz, Condillac, Wilhelm von Humboldt, John Stuart Mill and Frege, with the twentieth century represented in two final chapters, the first on early Wittgenstein, Carnap and Quine, followed by a chapter on later Wittgenstein, Derrida and Davidson. The selection and treatment of these writers is designed to bring into focus what Losonsky takes to be an unresolved issue in the philosophy of language between two attractive but seemingly opposed views. On the first of these, natural language is essentially constituted by a static, systematic form or structure that can be identified and effectively studied a priori, employing reason or intuition. Surface grammar may disguise it, but some such structure -- perhaps one particular structure -- is a condition of a language's being a language. On the second view, 'natural language' is the open-ended product of multifarious and shifting human linguistic activity, incapable of being tied down as the intelligible object of an explanatory science, and capable at best of being described piecemeal. Losonsky sets out to demonstrate that theoretical approaches to language since Locke have taken one side or other of this opposition, or have attempted unsuccessfully to achieve an acceptable synthesis. He concludes that an integrated approach is impossible in principle, perhaps because of the self-referential nature of a theory of language. But he also accepts that this conclusion is unproven, being simply 'the one best supported by the evidence' of 'the persistent diversity of competing views.'

The story begins with an analysis of the essential role that (Losonsky believes) Locke ascribed to words in human thought and cognition, as well as the dangers of confusion and misunderstanding he associated with that role. Losonsky offers several reasons for holding that Locke's view of language constituted something essentially new, initiating 'modern' philosophy of language and a modern conception of the importance of language to philosophy in general. He claims that Locke was interested in natural language, not to reform it, but to examine its role with respect to the nature, extent and limits of human knowledge; and that for Locke mind and language are so linked that neither can be understood on its own. Locke also believed that an analysis of the language employed in many disputes would resolve them.

All this puts a questionable spin on Locke's discussion of language. Losonsky takes issue with Nicholas Jolley's assertion that 'Locke's major theses concerning the metaphysics and epistemology of classification can be understood independently of his teachings about language.' But Jolley's point (I take it) is that words are for Locke aids to thought and memory that, however indispensable as such, do not enter into the essential processes of general thought and cognition, which are explained in terms of abstract ideas and relations between them. As Losonsky correctly points out, Locke does hold that names serve to fix ideas in the mind, and even function as the bonds that unify certain complex ideas, but it is the ideas themselves that are the 'materials' of knowledge and belief. The chief positive role of names is to bring the right ideas to mind. In the case of successful communication, that mind is the mind of the hearer. In the unconfused thought of an individual, the name records or promotes the same idea each time it is employed. This simple model underlies Locke's main interest in language, which is in the ways in which names commonly fail to fulfill these functions without our realizing it, and in which unthinking assumptions about names lead to such errors as the belief in real universals, natural species and transcendent eternal truths.

Consideration of antecedents of the Essay weakens Losonsky's argument for the novelty of Locke's view of language. Losonsky himself rightly finds antecedents to aspects of Locke's thinking about language in medieval logic and, particularly with respect to Locke's criticisms of syllogism and his analysis of ordinary ways of reasoning, renaissance humanism. Later, Hobbes not only anticipated Locke in his traditional account of the function of names as 'signs' and 'marks', but was also less equivocal in assigning an essential role to words in universal thought. Where Locke subordinated the functional generality of general names to that of the abstract ideas they stand for, Hobbes had asserted boldly that nothing is universal but names. Both Bacon and Hobbes, moreover, had indicted language as a source of errors in ways also specifically identified by Locke. Losonsky recognizes such continuities but insists, in my view less than convincingly, on the greater significance of differences. For example, although he is right that Locke differed from Hobbes and Bacon in that his interest in language was not yoked to an optimistic conception of scientific method, Losonsky's claim that Locke was not interested in the reform of natural language is misleading. Locke was certainly concerned to promote a more precise, stable and universally agreed 'philosophical' vocabulary based on observation and experiment, if only for scientific purposes away from the less demanding concerns of 'the market-place', i.e. ordinary life.

Losonsky, however, has in mind a contrast with the visionary schemes of Leibniz to create a perfect language that would be artificial, but would mirror the natural order of concepts and of reality. Such a language would have a logical form that comprehended all possible thought and, unlike the logical form of natural language, was open to view, not masked or distorted by contingencies of grammar. This ideal had not only scholastic, but also, more significantly, strong neoplatonist resonances, but Losonsky is interested in it as an endorsement of an approach to natural language through an analysis of its underlying logical form, an approach opposed to Locke's anti-formalism as well as to the later, strenuously naturalistic approach of Condillac. For Condillac, natural language is an inventive extension of animal cries and gestures, essentially an activity and a condition both of memory and rationality. Losonsky takes him to hold that how we reason depends on language, rather than that language is shaped by reason. So Leibniz and Condillac are taken to represent the unresolved opposition in modern philosophy of language. The 'idea that the study of language is at its core a formal discipline related … to mathematics and logic' is rooted in Leibniz's intellectualist philosophy of language. Condillac's 'use perspective' on language, on the other hand, asserts 'the primacy of observation', allegedly in tension with 'the very idea that there is a deeper structure that underlies the apparent structure' of language.

Humboldt's theory of language is presented as an attempt to combine recognition that a natural language at any time is the evolved and evolving product of a free and creative human activity, the employment of sounds in thought and communication, and yet that it will possess a structure or form that is common to all languages. This universal form reflects underpinning laws of 'intuition' (i.e., roughly, of the organization of perception) and of thought. Losonsky expounds Humboldt's conception of the mutual dependence and interaction of thought and language in what he, Losonsky, calls a feedback loop. The human mind of its nature forms concepts through the utterance of articulate sounds, and the sounds then serve to shape the way the mind thinks, determining even the objects of cognition. Moreover, each uttered sound is presented as having its place in the language, a structured whole. As language develops, thought becomes more refined and human beings become more able to deal cognitively with reality, coming closer to an understanding of nature. For Humboldt there are mysteries involved in language, both in the creative spiritual force that gives rise to the production of articulate sounds in the formation of concepts, and in the way in which individuals come to share a common language despite each having, in a sense, an idiolect reflecting his or her individual response to experience (an issue already present in Locke's Essay).

Losonsky plausibly sets Humboldt's approach against a Kantian background, rather than seeing him as a critic of the Kantian doctrine of categories in the way of Hamann and Herder. For Humboldt, Losonsky argues, the fundamental question that can be addressed through the study of languages is that of how sensibility combines with intellect in human cognition and epistemic progress -- a progress that may take a different form in linguistically different cultures, but which nevertheless shares a deep form that is universal. But Losonsky regards Humboldt's examination of languages as having failed to get to grips with semantics and logical form, being concerned rather with syntax and phonological structure.

Accordingly, we are told, it 'fell to John Stuart Mill to rekindle work on the logical form of natural language within a naturalistic framework.' His examination of language is directed towards its role as the instrument of belief and reasoning, a role that is essential except in the simplest cases. The import of a proposition or assertion is the object of a belief, and whatever can be believed can be asserted. Losonsky explains how Mill's analysis of propositions in terms of denotation and connotation ties in with his empiricist psychology, but argues that Mill differs from earlier empiricists (apart from Bentham) in taking propositions, rather than names, to be the primary linguistic unit. He concludes that Mill 'combines compositionality with the holism of Humboldt's perspective on language.' But simply taking propositions as linguistically primary is surely a very weak form of 'holism' in comparison with the robustly holistic judgements of Humboldt, not to speak of present-day holism. Losonsky seems to take it that, because Mill focuses on 'what is relevant to understanding inference', and so in some sense sees language as constituting a logically structured system, he also views that system holistically. The contrast can then be drawn with another element in Mill's thought, his 'romantic' commitment to creativity and 'the free development of individuality', a commitment that Mill himself associated with Humboldt. Losonsky sees cracks appearing with respect to Mill's distinction between 'verbal' and 'real' propositions, a division, as Losonsky puts it, between facts about the semantic features of language and all other facts. Mill recognizes, so Losonsky argues, that it is difficult to maintain a sharp distinction between the two classes of fact, or to distinguish 'verbal' from 'real' disputes. Moreover, natural language reflects the experience of people who use it, and different individuals are struck by different resemblances. Language is no more fixed than human nature, and grows organically as an essential medium of human development and diversity.

No such ambivalence is perceived in Frege's 'Platonist' conception of the logical form of natural language. In a dense chapter, Losonsky expounds the main features of Frege's philosophy of language, tying them in with his thinking about the language of mathematics. A number of debated points of interpretation are helpfully discussed, with criticisms of some common translations of Fregean terms (for example, that of 'Art des Gegebenseins' as 'mode of presentation', which is liable to mask the intended character of the relation). Losonsky sees Frege as firmly in the tradition initiated by Leibniz, but as influenced by Mill (in particular, by Mill's distinction between denotation and connotation) as well as reacting against Mill's naturalism and empiricism. Frege agreed with Mill that the ordinary 'language of life' is flexible and adaptable, but held that it is imperfect, philosophically misleading and quite unsuitable for the purposes of science when objective conceptual connections must be grasped with absolute precision and clarity. How far Frege was guided by the mathematical paradigm is evidenced by his thought that, ideally, every term in a language should express a unique 'sense'. So '6', '4+2', and '7-1' express just three precise ways of apprehending the same number, grasped by all who understand the expressions. One of the questions Losonsky wants to raise, I take it, is whether it is not a serious misconception of natural language to approach it in this way. What he does not doubt, and briefly indicates in this chapter (focusing on the function-argument analysis of propositions), is Frege's enormous influence, both positive and by way of reaction.

The penultimate chapter tells a story about this influence. Wittgenstein is presented as developing in the Tractatus the Fregean idea that whatever can be said or thought must have a certain logical form, but as paradoxically arguing that no scientific or, indeed, meaningful account can be given of that form. Formal structure is among the things that manifest themselves, but cannot be described. Carnap next appears in the story as, in effect, a heretical follower of Wittgenstein who agrees that logical truths are tautologies and that the propositions of traditional philosophy are senseless, but who nevertheless believes in the possibility of a systematic analysis of the logic of scientific discourse. The objects of such analysis are linguistic conventions constituting a framework for knowledge that can be evaluated and changed. The role of philosophy is to promote such improvement. Quine, in turn, while retaining much of Carnap's conception of the role of analytic philosophy as the handmaid of science, launches a multipronged assault on the assumption of a determinate and transparent framework of conventional meanings. That Quine's starting-point is linguistic behaviour gets him into the class of philosophers who see language as a human activity to be approached empirically, although his behaviourism sets him some way from Humboldt or Mill.

The final chapter is devoted to some prominent attempts to deconstruct the 'systematic' conception of language -- Wittgenstein's notion of language games, Derrida's critiques of structuralism and of J. L. Austin (a balanced discussion of the latter debate, with more emphasis than usual on affinities), and finally Davidson's arguments from deviant and creative uses of language.

Linguistic Turns in Modern Philosophy is something of an expository tour de force. Its juxtapositions are stimulating, its thesis challenging. Not all would agree with Losonsky's interpretations, or with his selection of 'landmarks' (Kripke is a notable exception), or with his moral, but his sober argument does at least raise the question whether 'system and performance… are dual aspects of language that cannot be integrated.'

One might complain that his exposition is insufficiently critical. It is only insofar as there are unanswerable arguments on both sides of a philosophical divide that their existence can reasonably be taken to point to some kind of irresoluble antinomy. The existence -- or persistence -- of bad arguments proves nothing. Losonsky signals cracks in existing attempts to take account of both 'aspects', but otherwise his criticisms are infrequent and unsystematic. The argument of Davidson that leads into Losonsky's final conclusion, for example, appeals to deviant or creative, but nevertheless interpretable, uses of language. But that these are so recognizably not 'standard' uses (how else would he have chosen his examples?) itself suggests that 'passing theories' as to the speakers' meaning in such cases are formed on the back of a more systematic and automatic understanding of the language used. This relationship does not seem to be beyond investigation.

The solution to Losonsky's problem, I would judge, will lie in a bottom-up understanding of how speech can, of its very nature, generate logical generality, beginning with the primitive relationship between the content of our animal perception of our environment and the logical form of basic subject-predicate sentences. That understanding, moreover, will take human intelligence into account without treating it as a formal competence consisting in adherence to propositional 'principles of reason' or 'laws of thought'. A main obstacle to a solution lies with top-down approaches that are either Platonically rationalist, or treat natural language as basically just one formal system among indefinitely many, as if we were free to choose another, or only prevented from doing so by innate hard-wiring. But to achieve such a solution would need long, hard argument, ranging across much of philosophy.