Lire le matérialisme

Lire Le Materialisme

Charles T. Wolfe, Lire le matérialisme, Préface de Pierre-François Moreau, ENS Éditions, 2020, 291pp., €29.00 (pbk), ISBN 9791036202377.

Reviewed by Ruth Edith Hagengruber, Paderborn University


This is a work on the history and philosophy of materialism spanning the ‘modern’ period broadly understood, running from the seventeenth century to contemporary thought. It is entitled Lire le matérialisme, that is, “Reading Materialism.”

“Reading Materialism” is ambiguous as a title as the focus and intention of this book is to challenge a broadly accepted and widespread understanding of materialism. Reading Materialism, after all, does not say, “Reread the materialists again,” but “Change the way you think about materialism.” There is something more to understanding what materialism is, which needs to be stressed. Charles Wolfe uses his arguments to strengthen the insight that materialism is crucial to enhancing the descriptive and experience-based philosophical and scientific endeavor when we understand it anew.

Wolfe has dealt with materialism in many of his previously written works. “Lire le matérialisme” is a collection of previously published papers, reworked and updated together with two unpublished chapters (notably on materialism and embodiment). But it is by no means a smorgasbord. In his preface, Pierre-François Moreau states the following: “This book is typological and hybrid. It is a matter of identifying themes that are enduring in a given period, perhaps with certain constants from one period to another, and of not assuming an a priori common essence to all the authors cited.”

The various essays—on materialism in historical perspective, materialism and dreams, the status of the brain, and embodiment—bring together an important idea of Wolfe’s, namely the possibility of a kind of a priori access to materialism, which he pursues by tracing the possibility of active and vital materialism from the 18th century to the present neo-materialists. Though, according to him, the right question from the start might be: Are we the heirs of Enlightenment materialism?

Re-reading materialism with Wolfe is to jump across the centuries to understand that Julien Offray de La Mettrie, with his analogy of mind and consciousness, perhaps offered a better representation than the protagonists of the identity theory of brain and mind in the 20th century. Wolfe insists that the materialism of the 18th century never dealt with dead matter, but always with matter related to the mind, to activity and vital forces.  Everything is about active and vital materialism and about the question of how the relation of matter to activity can be grasped. Wolfe seeks to provide a justification for materialism. Even when La Mettrie describes the body as clockwork, it is not a matter of reducing it to a mechanism, but rather of representing metabolic complexity. It is a mechanism that, in order to describe the living movements of bodies, invented the soul out of necessity, because the material variety of expression had exceeded its capabilities (238). The soul is thus an invention born from the deficits of mechanistic descriptions.

In this sense, active and passive matter are two paradigms of materialism. Active matter contains models in which matter, and even movement and thinking are ascribed dynamic and plastic characteristics, as Wolfe demonstrates, citing Denis Diderot. Animism or vitalism, as found, for example, in Margaret Cavendish, also belong to this tradition. Of course there are differences between the active materialism of the neo-materialists and those of earlier centuries or the Enlightenment. Though this kind of vitalism of the Early modern philosophy does not overlap with the active materialism of the bio-and neuro-sciences, one may acknowledge these historically prior forms as prefiguration that prepared our scientific understanding in favor of this direction.

There is an implicit thesis here that holds that classical materialism, referring to that of Diderot, La Mettrie, and Baron d’Holbach, is misunderstood by scholarly traditions. It is not and cannot be presented within a solely mechanist procedure; it served mechanism, but it serves any advancement in science. For Wolfe, materialism is the primordial category for science, experience and philosophy that is not possible without the various forms of a materialist metaphysics.

In sum, this book has two distinctive features. First, materialism from the 18th century onwards is not presented through the tradition of mechanism from which Wolfe laboriously tries to extricate it, but as part of a tradition that focuses on and seeks to attend to the structure of organic organization in the world and in the brain. Second, Wolfe connects the issues of 18th century materialism with those of the 20th and 21st centuries. Beyond this, the book also delivers an examination of the history of materialism and especially of the consequences of and for materialism after the (failed) interpretations of the mechanist and the brain-consciousness-identity theses. Re-read the heroes of 18th century materialism, Wolfe suggests, and see what amazing consequences they offer for 21st century interpretations. 

The examination of 20th century brain-mind identity theses is becoming the steppingstone for rejecting a certain kind of materialism. As such, it is entirely justified to turn back to the identity thesis and bring it into the debate once again. It is clear that Wolfe refuses to read the materialism of La Mettrie and Diderot on this basis. J.J.C. Smart’s and David Armstrong’s identity thesis is used to reframe our misconception of 18th century materialism. Good examples of how this work seeks to use historical ‘case studies’ to revise our core philosophical commitments and understandings of, e.g., matter-mind and brain-mind relations, are the particularly original chapters 5 and 6, on the ‘materialist theory of self’ and specifically on Diderot's account of the brain, in comparison to both earlier and later materialist theories. It is also the place that brings together what needs to be rethought. It is this book's strength that is focuses its debate on this relationship from the early modern and Enlightenment period until now and, of course, on asking whether there is a continuity between these times, even if Wolfe ends by strictly denying any continuity between them.  Even if the identity thesis of brain and consciousness is no longer relevant, it is not dead when applied to materialism and reduced to a mechanist model.  The identity theorists need the “mechanist dimension” (190), as it gives a “vision of science” and of scientific laws, and it reveals the intent of these theorists to make mental processes a part of this. However, Wolfe argues, these identity theories unveil a closet dualism in disguise. 

There are mental events and physical events and if there is a relationship between them that is causal, physical laws will follow from it.  If this causality holds, mechanism wins. But we should not make the mistake of reducing the physical and organic to the mechanical. It is a question of the organization of the organic and it is absurd to map ontology with the laws of physics alone. The materialist vision is not confined to an identified space or to a mechanistic chain, and yet this does not mean that the body has a nature that is beyond the physical universe—an objection that is crucial for Wolfe, as it enables him to articulate both a critique of mechanistic materialism and of anti-materialist or anti-naturalist doctrines of embodiment. Rereading materialism means overcoming a still predominant reading of this position as a mechanistic materialism. What is the actual relationship between materialism and the body? “Show me a thought and I'll show you the body behind it,” is still presented as a method or a heuristic principle that is basic and applies in all contexts. At this point Wolfe quotes Deleuze who referred to Plato saying that materialists, if they were intelligent, would speak of power rather than the body. But it is true, conversely, that dynamists, when they are intelligent, should speak first of the body in order to ‘think’ power (239).

Metaphysics that invokes science need not cling to physics alone, Wolfe holds, if we are ultimately dealing with a vitalist-inspired materialism that can integrate other forms. This includes the concepts of organization and “économie animale” which describe the irregularity of the organic body as a counterpart to a pure machine. Vital movements are so complex that mechanists had to postulate a soul to explain them, Wolfe states, defending La Mettrie and Diderot against the charge of mechanistic reductionism (237).  It is the living body that La Mettrie describes in his L'Homme-Machine. La Mettrie should not be read as having reduced the living and organic to the mechanist pattern. Rather, the organic in La Mettrie is tied to a modern Epicureanism; the soul is organic because it comes from the organism.

No wonder that Wolfe finds some support in the feminist theories that he discusses in chapter Eight, which is devoted to contemporary ‘New Materialism.’ Besides interesting references to Caroline Merchant and Donna Haraway, Wolfe reminds us of Iris Marion Young's article from 1980, “Throwing like a girl,” that fits well with his own account of materialist embodied thinking. Young argues in favor of an interpretation which shows bodily organization as a condition and orientation of specific and partly intimate conditions. From this perspective we understand a bodily female experience without transcendentalizing or spiritualizing it in any way. It is a bodily specificity, resulting from a bodily organization that concerns not only throwing, but also fighting, running, and other physical skills (244).

In contrast to the intuitive and crypto-dualistic appeals that Wolfe found in U.T. Place, Armstrong or Smart, the focus on materiality in recent feminist discourse is far less dualistic, he argues. This dualism is absent in the work of Karen Barad, who is the major figure in feminist science studies claiming to be naturalistic. Barad links science studies to a feminist ontology in which subject and object are, in her words, “intra-actively constituted within specific practices.” Barad's agential realism asserts that we are beholden to the material and to what the material is (227). In consequence, Wolfe does not avoid the question of what ‘material’ and ‘matter’ mean.

Materialism, science, and experience are crucial components of our knowledge. The primordiality of matter is a key trait of the beginning of science and implies the critique of anthropocentrism. This book is written in a perspective-widening attempt to combine historical, scholarly, and contextual information on a basis of systematic questions which illuminate the need for materialism as a philosophical strand. In that sense, Wolfe’s book is part of a project which has already long since integrated debates on contextualism and internalism that seem recurrent. For those who read French, it is a wonderfully written and readable introduction to the history of materialism from the 18th to the 20th centuries, deliberating on and correcting traditions of thought and misleading conceptual syntheses. There are not many books around that relate 18th century materialism to that of the 20th century. Moreover, it has a clear intention: to present the materialist standpoint as an elementary component of the philosophical and scientific self-understanding for philosophy.