Listening on All Sides: Toward an Emersonian Ethics of Reading

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Richard Deming, Listening on All Sides: Toward an Emersonian Ethics of Reading, Stanford University Press, 2008, 182pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780804757386.

Reviewed by David K. O'Connor, University of Notre Dame


Richard Deming's main project is to use the responsive openness called for in interpreting a text as a model for the ethical demands of human relationships. His secondary aim is to show that European literary theory and classical American literature are not strangers to each other, and in fact take up many of the same hopes and anxieties. The breadth and generosity of Deming's intellectual engagements are evident everywhere, and they account for the book's clear success in its secondary aim, as well as what I think are its interesting failures in its primary task. The author has done what his title asks, and listened on all sides, but his ethics is too undemanding to live up to Emerson's challenge.

The "sociality" of language, writes Deming, "brings up close the issue of ethics" (14). In a way, it is no surprise that Ralph Waldo Emerson figures prominently in such a project. "I do then with my friends as I do with my books," Emerson said,[1] and he meant it. For Emerson, reading and writing are the paradigm of all human life, and Deming does Emerson no violence in looking to him for an "ethics of reading," that is, to find guidance in our practices of attentive reading for how to treat people. Drawing the link between hermeneutics and ethics, however, may sound like rather a "continental" project, deriving as it does from early German Romantics such as the Schlegels and Schleiermacher, and having been given a major impetus by Gadamer (who quite surprisingly is never mentioned in the book). Indeed, Deming's theoretical orientation is much influenced by more recent heirs of this tradition: by Deleuze's Nietzsche readings, by Derrida, by The Literary Absolute of Lacoue-Labarthe and Nancy, by Charles Altieri's critical work on modernism and its aftermaths. The Heideggerian gesture of the book's subtitle is also not out of place. However, after the introductory theoretical chapter, Deming focuses on classics of American literature to pursue his theme, devoting a chapter essay each to Emerson, Herman Melville, and the pair Wallace Stevens and William Carlos Williams. Nathaniel Hawthorne, Emily Dickinson, and Walt Whitman all make more than cameo appearances.

Thinking of Wittgenstein's notion of forms of life, Deming says that

Knowing language, by way of looking (and listening) closely (to words and use) can create sensitivity to the intimacies it affords, and such intimacies include, or at least ought to, a sense of how we interact with each other and the world. One need invest his or her attention in the effects of language acts, attending to what words perform on others and on oneself. (14)

This intimate responsiveness is challenged or chastened, however, by what Deming calls skepticism, exemplified especially by the moving and multiple selves of Emerson's essays and Whitman's poetry (22). This skepticism is not a failure of knowledge. It is instead a strategy of freedom, an escape from the tendency to let intimacy harden into conformism. In Deming's pithy formulation, "The economy of resistance [skepticism] and identification [intimacy] is central to Emersonian modernism" (17). The elaboration of this central idea is the work of the strong second chapter of the book, an essay on Emerson's essay "Fate" that shows Deming's breadth and generosity at its best.

A striking virtue of Deming's Americanist slant on continental themes is the help he gives the reader in thinking through a central point of difference between two philosopher/critic pairs prominent in the book, Richard Rorty and Richard Poirier, and (more surprising) Stanley Cavell and Harold Bloom. Deming's critical vocabulary is, to my ear, more attuned to European literary theory than to the self-consciously American idiom of these four pioneers in the engagement of American literature with continental theory. Deming is more likely to sound like Hegel or Heidegger than like Emerson or Stevens, for example. However, though Deming is less successful, or at least less thorough-going, in establishing his own voice than these formidable predecessors, his ethical focus clarifies something at stake in their work. Deming shares Rorty and Poirier's rather chipper optimism about postmodernism's resources for accommodating ideals of solidarity with ideals of freedom, and these two authors appear in the book mostly as authorities to be affirmed. Cavell, despite his obvious importance for Deming's sense that his project is Emersonian, is treated more distantly, and Bloom is explicitly rejected. Deming nods a distant greeting to Cavell's perfectionism, and wants to replace Bloom's anxiety of influence, each great writer trying to trump the others, with a "nexus of sympathetic writers" (22). This sounds too much like a sewing circle to me; at any rate, Deming's optimism is averse to the rather dire imaginings of Cavell and Bloom about the tensions between individual genius and democratic principle. If I try to put this into Deming's own terms, I am tempted to say "intimacy" and an irenic solidarity seem to be the natural state of language-using human beings, with "resistance," conflict, and rivalry no better than an unpleasant tonic against complacency, and perhaps even an unhappy deviation from and distortion of what unfallen intimacy would be. Deming never brings himself, I believe, to embrace the energy or movement provided by resistance and rivalry, as he does embrace intimacy and solidarity.

Deming, then, does see the darker side of sociality, but he tends to treat competitiveness and rivalry as a pathology to be eliminated rather than as part of the very structure of the "dialectic of mutual recognition." Perhaps the desire to make recognition possible without requiring struggle is a noble one. Nevertheless, this desire seems to distort Deming's discussion of Herman Melville's struggles to free himself from Nathaniel Hawthorne's precedence (chapter 3). Deming uses to good effect Alexandre Kojève's account of the Master/Slave Dialectic to frame the issues Melville faced of originality and authority. However, Deming's antipathy to Bloom's antagonistic model of writing is so strong that he refuses it even for Melville's notorious rivalry with Emerson and Hawthorne. After a sensitive discussion of Melville's obsessive attempt to "praise Hawthorne and bury him" (the Shakespeare allusion is Deming's), Deming spoils the chapter by concluding that Melville exemplifies a strategy that replaces dominance with equality and competition with sympathy (105-106). This abrupt turn deflates the chapter and makes Melville sound juvenile or simply base for taking the struggle for recognition so seriously.

This flattening of the writer's ambition makes the concluding fourth chapter on Stevens and Williams the weakest in the book. Deming's extended discussion (126-132) of Stevens' poem "The American Sublime" is a revealing failure. The poem begins, "How does one stand | To behold the sublime" and uses an equestrian statue of Andrew Jackson, the exemplary political figure of America as a popular democracy, as an emblem of the tension between democracy and nobility, at least nobility as expressed in the dominate artistic traditions of Europe since the Renaissance. This tension puts a question mark in the title phrase, for it is far from obvious how an authentically American poetry can be sublime. It is the ambition to write sublime but yet American poetry that Stevens is exploring.

This reading of the poem is hardly debatable, especially since Stevens works over the same ground, including a discussion of the very statue he has in mind, in his lecture "The Noble Rider and the Sound of Words." The poem hinges on the awkwardness with which Democrat Jackson inhabited, both in the statue and when the statue was made, an aesthetic convention appropriate to aristocrats and mercenaries. This awkwardness is described in the lines "When General Jackson | Posed for his statue | He knew how one feels." That is, he knew how silly an equestrian statue in the grand style could look for a populist icon; and so he knew "how one feels" who aspires to an American aesthetic. Deming mistakenly takes the lines to mean Jackson does know how it feels to really experience the sublime, "because he lived through a war" (127). This gets these lines so wrong that nothing else in his reading has any value. In general, the transcendent longing in Stevens is underplayed, to emphasize issues about poets as creators of solidarity.

A characteristic Emerson epigram says to let your friend "be to thee for ever a sort of beautiful enemy" ("Friendship" 351). Better a provocative enemy than a sleepy friend, someone who puts us into the comfort zone of conformity. "Almost all people descend to meet," warned Emerson, and for Emerson solidarity, even as marital intimacy, could never take precedence over ascent ("Friendship" 345). The costs of giving up oneself inappropriately, or on the other hand of refusing to follow another's lead, the dire dynamics of abnegation and narcissism, are the very stuff of what Cavell has labeled Emersonian perfectionism, exemplified in Emerson's difficult essays. Deming makes his literary heroes less anxious and rivalrous than Cavell or Bloom would have them, or than Emerson saw them. A literary exemplar, as Emerson constantly reminds his reader, will threaten to smother as much as to inspire. For Emerson, Plato is the acknowledged exemplar of exemplarity, and so reveals at their most extreme both the pleasures and pains of writing under an influence. "Even the men of grander proportion," Emerson wrote, "suffer some deduction from the misfortune (shall I say?) of coming after this exhausting generalizer… . Plato is philosophy, and philosophy, Plato, -- at once the glory and the shame of mankind" ("Plato" 633). How are we latecomers to inherit a literary glory that can put us to shame? Can we make that glory our own? For Emerson, this is an acute problem for America, both as democracy and as New World: "In every work of genius we recognize our own rejected thoughts: they come back to us with a certain alienated majesty" ("Self-Reliance" 259). We may be grateful for the majesty, but we are bound to resent somewhat the alienation.

Compared to this, Deming's version of a democratic ideal of mutual accommodation and appreciation strikes me as rather easy-going. His favorite word for this ideal is "negotiation," but it is a negotiation in which enthusiasm for the process of reaching agreement comes close to eclipsing competition and mutual wariness. Just how opposed to Emerson this ideal of "negotiation" is comes out in an extraordinary way in the very title of the book. The phrase "listening on all sides" comes from a passage in Emerson's essay "Experience," a passage that is never, I believe, mentioned or alluded to in the book. There is good reason for this, since Emerson uses the phrase to reject an ethic of sympathy and social solidarity, in favor of an ethic of self-reliance:

A sympathetic person is placed in the dilemma of a swimmer among drowning men, who all catch at him, and if he gives so much as a leg or a finger, they will drown him… . In this our talking America, we are ruined by our good nature and listening on all sides. This compliance takes away the power of being greatly useful. A man should not be able to look other than directly and forthright. A preoccupied attention is the only answer to the importunate frivolity of other people: an attention, and to an aim which makes their wants frivolous. (490, emphasis added)

Deming's anti-competitive ideal of "negotiation" has interesting affinities with John Rawls' ideal of democracy as a "social union of social unions" (in Part 3, Chapter IX, Section 79 of A Theory of Justice). Rawls notes that this ideal has roots in early German Romanticism (especially Wilhelm Von Humboldt), which also nurtures Deming's project. For Deming, as for Rawls, Rorty, Poirier, and Cavell, it is a live philosophical question how to use these Romantic resources to construct an American ideal. One thinks particularly of Rorty's discussion of Whitman in the first chapter of Achieving Our Country (1998), and of Cavell's engagement with Rawls (surely deserving of more attention than it has received) in "The Conversation of Justice: Rawls and the Drama of Consent," in Conditions Handsome and Unhandsome: The Constitution of Emersonian Perfectionism (2000). It is another virtue of Deming's book that it contributes to this conversation, even though he views the issues from a primarily literary rather than political perspective.


[1] "Friendship" 353, in Essays and Lectures, New York: Library of America, 1983. Subsequent references to Emerson are to this edition.