Listening to Ourselves: A Multilingual Anthology of African Philosophy

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Chike Jeffers (ed.), Listening to Ourselves: A Multilingual Anthology of African Philosophy, SUNY Press, 2013, 194pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438447438.

Reviewed by Albert Mosley, Smith College


This is a collection, edited by Chike Jeffers, of essays by prominent African philosophers from both East and West Africa addressing issues of philosophical interest to African audiences in their respective native languages. It is intended to stimulate local discussions among Africans who may not be professional philosophers, but who have an interest in the topics presented. All of the essays are accompanied by English translations, making them accessible throughout the Anglophone world.

The first essay is by Souleymane Bachir Diagne of Senegal, and is in Wolof. The title of the article is "Truth and Untruth." The essay is constructed around a dialogue between two friends on the nature of truth and whether something is true because it was believed by our ancestors. For example, our ancestors believed in sorcery, and because of this people have continued to believe in sorcery. Yet Islam rejects sorcery. A passage in the Koran admonishes naysayers for cleaving to local traditions and failing to recognize the superior truth of Islam. It appears that a belief based on tradition or what the ancestors said does not make that belief true. The traditions that our ancestors practiced had to be changed with Islam. And now, Islam itself faces the challenges of Christianity and modernity.

The discussants conclude that belief determines what we accept as true, rather than truth determining what we believe. Using religion rather than science in order to discuss the difference between truth and belief may prove more effective for an audience more attuned to religion than to science. And doing this in a dialogue between friends makes the encounter more personal and accessible.

The second essay, "The Ethiopian Conception of Time and Modernity" by Messay Kebede of the University of Dayton, is in Amharic. Kebede proposes examining how the concept of time shapes Ethiopian identity and Ethiopia's relationship to modernity. He distinguishes between a cyclical conception of time and a teleological conception of time. In the cyclical conception of time, things change into what they are not, and then back again. We are always becoming what we were not. This means that those who are down may move up, and those who are up may move down.

The teleological conception of time is linear: we begin at a certain point, a, and are oriented toward achieving a certain end, b. We go from a to b where b is the end achieved by the journey through time from a. Kebede argues that prior to Haile Selassie, Ethiopians maintained a cyclical conception of time. But with Selassie, Amharic Ethiopians became the only source of power, and Selassie's family became a necessary condition of exercising power. In this way, Post-Selassie Ethiopia replaced the cyclical with a teleological conception of time.

Kebede recommends an Ethiopian Renaissance in which Ethiopia returns to its traditional concept of time. But it is not obvious how to reconcile a cyclical time with teleological time conceived as the journey from sin to salvation and the Second Coming of Christ. Moreover, one of main consequences of the European Renaissance was a rejection of spiritual agency in the natural and social world. Will this be necessary for Ethiopia in particular and Africa in general? Or should an African renaissance return us to its spiritualistic sources?

The third essay, "A Proverb Never Lies: On the Nature of Proverbs and How They Differ from Propositions" by D. A. Masolo of the University of Louisville, is in Luo. Masolo is concerned that contemporary generations of Luo youth are losing touch with the Luo language and the role of traditional Luo proverbs.

For Masolo, traditional Luo proverbs are not claims; they do not provide descriptions of the world that are either true or false. Rather, proverbs "indicate general impressions about the world" (37), and because of this, they are neither true nor false. Hence, a proverb never lies. Nonetheless, Masolo insists that proverbs are useful because they enable people to develop a deeper understanding of the situations to which the proverbs are applied.

I agree with Masolo that proverbs are not meant to be descriptions. But characterizing them as "general impressions" that a people have produced fails to elucidate their epistemic role in traditional thought. I suggest we view proverbs and parables as analogical models establishing classes of similar situations, similar problems, and similar solutions, but encountered in different circumstances. Viewed in this way, we may find that proverbs have as important a role to play in modern thought as they have played in traditional thought.

The fourth essay, "What's in a Name? Four Levels of Naming Among the Luo People" by F. Ochieng'-Odhiambo of the University of the West Indies, is also written in Luo. Like Masolo, Ochieng'-Odhiambo is concerned that traditional Luo practices and beliefs are on the verge of disappearing. While Masolo looked at the use of proverbs, Ochieng'-Odhiambo looks at the use of names. He views the trend of Luo youth towards adopting European names and relinquishing Luo names as a form of disrespect to the Luo tradition.

European names, Ochieng'-Odhiambo claims, tell one nothing about the thing named, but simply serve to distinguish the thing named from all other similar things. But in traditional Luo practices, names tell us something about the person and the circumstances that have shaped the person. A traditional name provided a key to understanding the character and development of the person named. He concludes with the question: "which is a better custom of naming between that of the Luo and that of white people[?]" (83).

Ochieng'-Odhiambo should be aware that not all European names are mere indexicals. Traditional European names often carried information about the person so named. A person named Carpenter or Smith was probably from a family of carpenters or blacksmiths. As with traditional Luo names, such names provided a key to understanding the background and character of the person named.

"What's in a Name?" cites many notable African intellectuals and freedom fighters (Oginga Odinga, Ngũgĩ wa Thiong'o, Kwasi Wiredu, Kwame Ture, Molefi Kete Asante) who disavowed their European names and adopted traditional African names as a way of replacing a European identity with an African identity. Clearly, adopting names with a traditional significance has played an important role in the post-colonial world.

The fifth article, by Betty Wambui of SUNY Oneonta, written in Kikuyu, is "Conversations: Women, Children, Goats, Land." Wambui's essay was motivated by a friend's observation that, among the traditional Kikuyu people, women, children, goats, and land were regarded as similar things. While women were neither goats nor land, all were similar in that they could be owned by men. Women were destined to be property, and men were destined to be property owners.

A woman could have only one husband, but a husband could have many wives. When a member of the husband's initiation group visited and spent the night, the husband was expected to offer him one of his wives for the night. As girls progressed to women, they were supposed to exhibit greater humility and subordination, while "the status of men as husbands is one that increases the extent of one's power" (103).

But Wambui also reminds us that not all women were subjugated. Some women were prophets, sorcerers, healers, midwives, warriors, etc. And their exceptional abilities allowed them to demand exceptional treatment. While these women did not hold men as property, they sometimes did hold other women as property. Exceptional women who could not bear children could marry other women and have them impregnated to bear children. We are left to ask: Should the status of exceptional women become the modern norm for Kikuyu women? Or should Kikuyu women cease to be a form of property for either men or women?

The sixth essay, "Word and Mind" is by the eminent philosopher Emmanuel Chukwudi Eze (recently deceased) of Depaul University. The essay is in Igbo, Eze's native language. Eze begins with an Igbo parable meant to remind us that no one knows everything. Likewise, no language should be considered sufficient to express all truths. Every language has knowledge within it that may be useful to others who do not speak that language. Given this, Eze asks whether it would be useful to do philosophy in the Igbo language.

Eze distinguishes the study of philosophy in the Igbo language from the study of Igbo philosophy: philosophy done in Igbo may not reflect the philosophy that derives from Igbo culture. Eze disavows the suggestion that to do Igbo philosophy one must be an Igbo speaker. He is well aware that one can write about and discuss Igbo philosophy without being of this culture. Nonetheless, he thinks it is important for Igbo speakers to discuss philosophy in the Igbo language.

He proposes a dialogue about Igbo philosophy among people who speak Igbo. He calls such a dialogue "Listening to Ourselves." He suggests that doing philosophy in Igbo might help articulate knowledge implicit within the language. He endorses Kwasi Wiredu's call for conceptual decolonization by using traditional African languages to understand and evaluate claims made in European languages.

Eze's discussion of Paulin Hountondji -- well known in African philosophy for the thesis that without literacy, there can be no philosophy -- is especially insightful. For Hountondji, literacy allows us to reflect on what we say and build knowledge on the basis of objective inferences. Hountondji denies that traditional African cultures are closed to new ideas and insists that African cultures must cultivate literate modes of expression if they are to develop science and philosophy. Eze stresses that knowledge does not derive only from traditional beliefs, but from many unexpected sources. Even the very idea of an Igbo philosophy and an Igbo language are the result of contact with Europeans.

Eze proposes that traditional Igbo thinkers viewed a mind as that which was capable of uniting different ideas and perspectives. Because every individual is capable of multiple perspectives, each person can have a dialogue within himself. In this way, traditional Igbo culture construed a person as one who listens to others. And knowledge was "the art of bringing together word and thought in a way that clarifies the world" (149).

The final essay, written in Akan, is "Good and Evil" by Kwasi Wiredu of the University of South Florida.

Wiredu explains that in traditional Akan culture, good is what brings well-being, and evil is what brings troubles. But not everything that brings trouble is considered evil. If I strike at the snake that is near your foot, and I miss the snake and strike your foot with my machete, I may harm you but there was no intent to harm. Thus, my act was not evil, though certainly misguided. It also was not a good deed, since it did not bring greater well-being. When we criticize another's behavior, we point out how the behavior harms others. Harm may result, even when the doer of the act intended to help.

Something is good if it brings well-being, but the good consequences that result under conditions A may not be good consequences under conditions B. Likewise, a custom that is good for one place, time, or era may be bad for a different place, time, or era. Polyandry, like monogamy and polygamy, is a form of marriage that may be good under certain conditions but bad under different conditions. Whether a marriage system should be monogamous, polygamist, or polyandrous is not determined by the moral law, but by custom.

Many customs were justified by attributing them to the ancestors, as a way of gaining credibility and authority for one point of view. But Wiredu holds that only certain things such as murder, rape, theft, and deception were intrinsically evil because they were contrary to the First Law of Akan traditional morality: "Do not do to others what you would not have them do to you." In Akan moral life, musuo are behaviors that are universally condemned. But it is not because musuo are taboo. Musuo are bad not just because the ancestors say they are bad, but the ancestors say they are bad because they are harmful and intended to be harmful.

For Wiredu, traditional Akan notions of the good are grounded in pragmatism rather than spiritualism. We are better off if we believe that spiritual forces sanction the good things we do and censure the bad things we do. He writes: "In truth, if it were not in a lot of heads that God hates evil and will punish it, there would be much more evildoing than now" (173).

This collection continues a discussion among Africans about the relationship between their traditional and modern identities. In addressing the dualities of belief and truth, cyclical and linear time, names and descriptions, proverbs and propositions, thought and language, property and persons, good and evil, the essays raise many philosophical issues that are of interest to both African and non-African audiences. The dual-language format will be especially useful for language learning instruction between English and the languages represented. Let us hope more like this will follow. It is a research program with many benefits.