Listening to Reason in Plato and Aristotle

Listening To Reason In Plato And Aristotle

Dominic Scott, Listening to Reason in Plato and Aristotle, Oxford University Press, 2020, 268pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198863328.

Reviewed by Chris Bobonich, Stanford University


Both the Republic and the Nicomachean Ethics suggest that not all people are capable of benefiting from rational ethical arguments. In this excellent book, Dominic Scott carefully examines both works to try to clarify Plato’s and Aristotle’s views and their reasons for them. He remains focused on the Republic and the Nicomachean Ethics, but occasionally draws on Plato’s Laws as well as Aristotle’s Politics and Rhetoric.

Scott’s guiding question is: how many people did Plato and Aristotle believe ‘could be reasoned into valuing moral virtue [for itself]’ (2)? (The moral/non-moral distinction is Scott’s. I don’t think that he characterizes it clearly and I would not myself talk of ‘morality’ when discussing ancient ethics.) I’ll first discuss Scott’s treatment of Plato and then turn to Aristotle.

Scott claims that each of three routes distinguished in the Republic—the shorter, the longer and the middle—corresponds to an argumentative strategy. The text mentions only the first two, but Scott argues that we’ve good reason to posit the middle route (5). The shorter route consists of Republic’s Books 2–4, which raise and answer the interlocutors’ challenge about justice. It’s confined to ‘political analysis and moral psychology’, and doesn’t refer to Forms, or Republic 5–7’s metaphysics and epistemology (13). The Republic doesn’t contain the longer route which consists of using its epistemology and metaphysics, especially knowledge of the Form of the Good, to answer the same questions. Books 5–7 illustrate the ‘middle route’ which discusses epistemology and metaphysics, but without proceeding from definitions of Forms and without requiring knowledge of Forms.

Scott gives us a synoptic view of the Republic’s relevant passages and brings fresh illumination not just to the texts that he examines, but to the Republic in general.  For example, Scott distinguishes whether a particular passage is, or could be, addressed to the reader or Kallipolis’ citizens as well as the interlocutors. We might fruitfully apply this strategy to the rest of the Republic.

Analyzing as many relevant passages as possible has significant benefits, since previous discussions have focused only on some subset. Scott’s more comprehensive examination allows them to illuminate each other. But at some important points, Scott’s conclusions are, I think, unclear and his arguments for these conclusions underdeveloped. Let me give a few examples.

First, Scott characterizes his inquiry as asking who can be reasoned into ‘valuing moral virtue [for itself]’ (2). (I assume this means as a ‘final, i.e., non-instrumental good’, not as an unconditional or independent good.) According to Scott, the shorter route—the text of Books 2–4—does this by showing that psychic harmony is ‘like bodily health and therefore valuable [presumably in itself] to the agent (443C9–445B4)’ (12).

But this is odd in several ways. Book 2’s challenge is to show that justice is a final good and that, roughly, the just person is happier than the unjust person in all circumstances. Scott mentions only the first claim. Does he think that this is all that the shorter route shows? This is a very weak conclusion that’s consistent with the unjust life often (or even usually) being better than the just life.

Perhaps Scott thinks that the shorter route proves both claims and this may seem the obvious charitable construal. But the more comprehensive claim would be difficult for Scott to embrace. He adds the additional constraint that the shorter route only appeals to ‘non-moral values that [the addressees] already espouse’ (134). First, it’s hard to see the rationale for limiting considerations to non-moral values already held—what’s wrong with allowing rational argument to convince people that something new is non-morally good? It can’t be justified by the idea that they can’t change their ends, since the argument is supposed to convince them that justice is good in itself. Second, it seems unlikely that the just person is always happier unless we attribute enormous non-moral eudaimonic value to justice in itself (or appeal to the claim that non-moral goods don’t benefit the non-virtuous, but Books 2–4 don’t endorse this thesis). At this point in the Republic, however, listeners attributing great value to honor or bodily pleasures haven’t been given reason to think that psychic harmony is a great good in itself. Third, how can the audience accept psychic harmony as an account of justice without drawing on their ‘moral’ intuitions about justice?

Additionally, Book 4 neither sketches the good nor mentions reason’s distinctive good features (as Scott agrees, 13). For all that’s been shown by Book 4’s end, psychic harmony may include character states that both common sense and Plato himself would consider forms of vice, for example, those of a cooperative band of robbers (Rep. 1.351D7–E7). (Rep. 4.442D11–443B6 is simple unargued assertion.)

Finally, even granting that psychic harmony is analogous to bodily health, Book 4 doesn’t rule out that physical health is valuable only instrumentally. Glaucon accepts that physical health is good in itself (Rep. 2.357C2–4), but many of Plato’s potential addressees might think that health is only good for the sake of the pleasures to which it gives rise. (Indeed, if Plato in the Republic accepts that non-ethical goods only benefit their possessor if she’s virtuous, he doesn’t think that physical health is good in itself).[1] Plato has arguments against hedonism, but they’re not in Book 4. The argument from the health analogy to the claim that the just person is always better off is much worse (Irwin 1995, 254–6).

If this is the best that Scott thinks the shorter route can do, then this route accomplishes much less than originally seemed to be the case. If the gaps in Book 4’s arguments can only be made good (or are best made good) by the epistemological and metaphysical theses of Books 5–7, then the shorter route seems to offer little in itself. Scott should be sympathetic to this, since a satisfactory argument must appeal to the great value of the good states of the soul’s Reasoning part and Scott agrees that Book 4 is ‘extremely vague’ about this (13).

As I’ve noted, Scott helpfully distinguishes the various audiences that Plato might address and I’ll conclude my discussion of Scott on Plato by considering the producers and the auxiliaries. Although Scott’s account is nuanced, he’s generally optimistic about their rational capacities. Both groups can have beliefs about the Forms (39), although he only supports this by the claim ‘in some sense, it must be possible to have beliefs about the Forms’ (20). Both auxiliaries and producers ‘make some effort to philosophize’ which presumably sometimes succeeds, and Scott cites Rep. 7.518B7–519A6 as evidence that every human soul can know the Forms (21, 118). But attaining such knowledge requires that one lack strong appetitive desires and spirited emotions, study mathematics, and possess some additional good psychic qualities (Rep. 6.485A4–487A8). Scott agrees that only a few, the philosopher-rulers, can meet these requirements and know the Forms (22–6). Nevertheless, both lower classes can rationally revise their goals (116–18).

But Plato never suggests that the lower two classes are to make an effort to philosophize (see Rep. 6.494E3), and never tries to institutionalize the instruction they’d need. Since Scott relies on this lack of institutionalization to argue that the lower classes, although they could engage in moral argument, don’t do so (117), he should accept the same argument about helping them philosophize. According to Scott, there’s ‘no need’ for moral argument because the auxiliaries and the producers aren’t exposed to false philosophers or corrupting influences (117). But surely Plato would think that if the auxiliaries and the producers were capable of intellectual improvement, then they would be better off by undergoing it. Since Kallipolis aims at the city’s greatest well-being, it would have to provide such help or Plato would need to argue that the auxiliaries’ and the producers’ well-being is to be sacrificed for the city’s overall well-being.

Book 8 divides characters into five types: the just person or the philosopher, the timocrat, the oligarch, the democrat and the tyrant (544B4–545C4). All of these are forms of vice and have incorrect fixed ends (Rep. 4.445C1–E3, 8.543C7–A8, 544D5–545C6, 9.580C10–581C6). If the lower classes are to be amenable to reasoning about ends, they cannot fall into these kinds which have fixed wrong ends. Scott responds to this worry with the novel suggestion that these five character types aren’t kinds of characters, but rather ‘constitute the elements out of which human characters [are] composed’ (84). But this seems doubtful. First, the character types have incompatible attitudes, including beliefs about the good. We need an account of how they combine that avoids attributing contraries to the same soul part. Second, it would be better to say that people only partially instantiate these character types and sometimes have features only found in one of the other types. This seems possible, but it would then be puzzling that Plato never says this and never suggests that the auxiliaries’ and the producers’ characters differ greatly from the five character types, especially since there seems to be no such difference for philosophers. Why would Plato leave the nature of the auxiliaries’ and the producers’ characters such a mystery? Second, Scott points to Rep. 8.544C1–545C4 as evidence for his view. There Socrates denies that there’s any other form of politeia (τινα ἄλλην . . . ἰδέαν πολιτείας, Rep. 8.544C8) or any politeia that differs in form (ἐν εἴδει . . . τινι κεῖται, Rep. 8.544C8–D1) from those mentioned. This is hard to reconcile with the view that mixtures of these forms are the character types that people actually have. Socrates cites as examples ‘hereditary principalities’ and ‘purchased kingships’ (δυναστεῖαι . . . ὠνηταὶ βασιλεῖαι, Rep. 8.544D1). But both dunasteiai and purchased kingships are merely forms of kingship (Gorg. 492B3, Lg. 3.680B2, 3.681D3, 4.711D7, Rep. 6.499B7). Socrates continues to say (Rep. 8.544D5–545C6) that there are as many human characters as there are forms of politeia which also suggests that the five character types are the actual types found among people. Third, if the auxiliaries’ and the producers’ actual characters aren’t to be interpreted as forms of vice, then they’ll have to contain, as a substantial component, the philosophic character type and it’s hard to find evidence for this. Finally, Scott’s suggestion undermines one of the Republic’s main conclusions which is that well-being is directly proportional to virtue. Rep. 9.580B1–E6 ordinally ranks the character types with respect to virtue and well-being. But if they’re merely elements of myriad actual characters, we need much more information to determine how virtuous each combination is and whether the more virtuous combinations always produce greater well-being.

Let me now turn to Aristotle. Scott characterizes the Nicomachean Ethics’ audience as philosophers who might advise rulers, not legislators or young men going into politics (123). Scott sees the Nicomachean Ethics’ main task as reaching a worked-out definition of eudaimonia which is the first principle of political science and can be used in crafting legislation (128). Nevertheless, in studying political science, his audience ‘should resist the urge to delve too deeply into’ metaphysics and psychology (123). Such a recommendation may be defensible as an interpretation, but it requires more discussion. If Aristotle’s basic ethical claims are ‘base[d]’ on his metaphysics and psychology, why discourage philosophers from following their natural inclinations to seek deeper explanations (123)? The notion of basing is vague and the fact that some claims belonging to one science are in some way prior to the claims of another science doesn’t entail that the latter is subordinate to the former. The case might instead be like that of medicine and geometry (Post. An. 1.13, 79a13–16). A doctor knows that curved wounds heal more slowly, while a geometer knows why. But here a deeper explanation seems to have practical benefits: a doctor who understands the relevant aspects of plane geometry could apply her knowledge to indefinitely many other cases. Why shouldn’t the relation between political science and metaphysics or biology be like this?

Scott’s initial characterization of those amenable to rational persuasion is highly restrictive: ‘Aristotle claims that anyone who is to benefit from his lectures, and . . . from the use of reason quite generally, must have had the right upbringing’ (124), citing Nicomachean Ethics Book 1, 3–4. Aristotle also explicitly excludes the young, the akratic, and those who live by feeling, including the many (NE 1.3, 10.9). (Women are also excluded from studying politikê, 191–2). But Scott shortly thereafter claims that exclusion from Aristotle’s lectures may not be co-extensive with exclusion from ‘moral argument quite generally’ (127). But how could this broader class benefit from this use of reason without the right upbringing?

Scott proceeds to argue that, for example, the incontinent and the young could benefit from moral argument, but only if they’re motivated by the noble (kalon, 224). The apparent contradiction is resolved by holding that the excluded can’t benefit from the analysis that the Nicomachean Ethics itself contains, but can benefit from rhetorical argument that’s similar to how reason addresses the soul’s non-rational parts in NE 1.13 (224). This is an intriguing suggestion that deserves more discussion than I can provide here. I’ll just note that it’s more attractive if we think, as Scott does, that the soul’s spirited part can grasp the kalon as such. If we don’t, we should moderate Scott’s account of NE 1.3 by pointing out that young people’s lack of a full correct upbringing doesn’t exclude them from benefitting from the use of reason generally: they can profit from mathematical education. Nor is it the case that knowledge never benefits akratics: it doesn’t benefit them when their desires and emotions prevent them from acting upon their knowledge but no one is akratic all the time. In this case, rational ethical argument addressed to their reason might benefit young people (although they would still lack experience) if it’s accompanied or preceded by appeals to their desires and emotions that reduce their tendency to act akratically.

Scott also argues in some of the book’s most interesting sections that parts of the Nicomachean Ethics contain moral protreptics (135–46, 181–6, 191–2, 205–8). They’re designed to ‘immunize’ those with basically good characters who are still subject to temptation and to accepting bad arguments (7, 131–7). Reinforcement may be ‘internal’ (appealing to moral premises) or ‘external’ (appealing to non-moral premises). Scott concentrates on external reinforcement (145), but one might worry that either such reinforcement encourages people to have the wrong motivations for virtuous action or that the non-moral goods to which external reinforcement appeals won’t benefit their possessor unless she believes truly that their acquisition and use is consistent with virtue.

In the manner of reviewers, I’ve focused on areas of disagreement and various worries. This shouldn’t be taken as a negative judgment on the book’s value. It’s comprehensive, well-written, and deeply thought-provoking whether or not one accepts particular arguments. Everyone working in ancient ethics will benefit from reading it with the care it so clearly deserves.


I would like to thank Rupert Sparling for his acute comments on an earlier draft of this review.


Irwin, Terence, (1995), Plato’s Ethics, Oxford University Press.


[1] Plato accepts this Dependency claim in Euthyd. 278E3–282D3, Laws 1.631B3–D6, 2.660D11–662C5, and Meno 87C5–89A7