Literary Philosophers: Borges, Calvino, Eco

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Gracia, Jorge J.E. and Korsmeyer, Carolyn, (eds.), Literary Philosophers: Borges, Calvino, Eco, Routledge, 2002, 248pp, $23.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415929180.

Reviewed by Gerald Bruns, University of Notre Dame


Literary Philosophers is a collection of essays derived from a conference held at SUNY-Buffalo in 1999. The conference was devoted to the work of Jorge Luis Borges, Italo Calvino, and Umberto Eco—writers of what one might call “conceptual fiction,” or fiction that achieves a certain intellectual complexity by means of bizarre premises, arbitrary constraints, verfremdung, polymathy, and frequently comic reflections on how fiction-writing is possible and what it might be for. Ostensibly the question regulating the discussions here is whether these writers can be called “literary philosophers” (which sounds alarmingly like “honorary philosophers”). In fact, the relationship between philosophy and literature only comes alive when philosophers and literary people cross one another’s borders and begin reading each other, and fortunately, this is what happens in this volume. Half of the twelve contributors are philosophers and almost all have written important things on philosophical subjects, and in any case everyone proves to be a skillful and sophisticated reader of Borges, Calvino, and Eco.

In “Intersections of Philosophy and Literature, or Why Ethical Criticism Prefers Realism,” Deborah Knight surveys some different ways of linking literature and philosophy. The most traditional way (once called “allegory”) is to contextualize a literary work within the framework of some philosophical doctrine, argument, or problem—for example, the problem of indiscernibles, as when Borges’ Pierre Menard composes (without copying) a text that matches, word for word, Cervantes’ Don Quixote—a case of two different works incarnated in identical texts (the narrator observes that of the two, Menard’s is “infinitely richer,” which one would do well to take as a joke at the expense of the problem of indiscernibles). Several contributors devote attention to this story and its conceptual difficulties. Jorge J. E. Gracia uses it to develop a distinction between text and work and to argue (against a certain strain of poststructuralism) that literary works are embedded in their texts in ways that philosophical works are not. The identity of a literary work is folded into the materiality of its language, whereas the identity of a philosophical work lies in ideal objects like concepts and arguments that can be translated from one text to another without loss. So, an analytic distinction between philosophy and literature holds its ground. However, a diehard Aristotelian could argue that the identity of a poetic work is folded into the materiality of its language, whereas literary narratives, like philosophical arguments, share something of the ideality of geometry. A modernist might reply that, yes, a plot (at least) is theoretically translatable into any language, but the work in which it is embedded might not be. One thinks of Sterne’s Tristram Shandy.

Deborah Knight is a philosopher disguised as a modernist. She is mainly interested in the importance that moral philosophers like Martha Nussbaum and humanist literary critics like Wayne Booth attach to novels like Henry James’s The Golden Bowl. Novels in general are good at giving us thick descriptions of human beings in complex moral situations where the question of how to act cannot be answered by consulting a universal principle or even local Sittlichkeit. Nussbaum argued famously that such thick descriptions of human life count as moral knowledge, where moral knowledge comes to mean something like what Aristotle meant by the sort of experience on which phronesis depends. The Golden Bowl on this view would be a novel that doesn’t just illustrate something philosophical; it is the thing itself. Knight thinks this is all very well, but wouldn’t Nussbaum’s theory run up against a limit in the works of Borges, Calvino, and Eco (among other modernist texts), where complexities of form and language defeat mimesis? One could answer by appealing, as Knight does, to Arthur Danto, who has argued, along with Paul Ricoeur and numerous literary critics, that narrative literature (at least) is philosophical, or anyhow more philosophical than history, just to the extent that it constitutes a vast anthropology of possible worlds, not all of which need conform to conventions of nineteenth-century literary realism. But it might still be true that the possibility of literature as moral (or any other kind of) philosophy comes to an end when texts lose the logical integrity, and hence transparency, of Aristotelian form. Given the sometimes impossibly dense materiality of its language, much of contemporary poetry in Europe, Britain, and America is a philosopher’s no-man’s land.

Knight’s question about form, and Gracia’s theory of the text, are useful because they require us to think about what counts as literature in the first place. In fact this is the inquiry that the self-reflexive fictions of Borges, Calvino, and Eco (not to mention literary or aesthetic modernism in general) tacitly pursue. In this respect, their work might be philosophical, not in form, but in practice. Knight urges us to recall Arthur Danto’s end-of-art argument that Andy Warhol’s Brillo Box is philosophical just for the way it calls itself into question. Modernist art and literature confront us with the shortfall of criteria for determining what it is we’re looking at. We need in advance what performance artists call a support language—a theory—that will enable us to pick out an object or event as a piece of art, poetry, theater, or whatever. As Knight wittily suggests, an arthurdantist might claim that philosophy is therefore a condition of art. At least it is arguable that all of modernism is a kind of conceptual art, whatever status we accord the theoretical work on which it rests. Imagine the manifesto, that most modernist of literary genres, as a genre of philosophy. Or, again, one can’t do philosophical aesthetics these days without first doing extensive field work in twentieth-century avant-garde movements.

In “Philosophy and the Philosophical, Literature and the Literary, Borges and the Labyrinthine,” William Irwin thinks that we ought to respond to the modernist shortfall of criteria by appropriating Wittgenstein’s notion of “family resemblances.” Family resemblances do the work of theory in helping us to pick out distinctive features. There is no one thing that can be called philosophy or literature, but literary texts can be philosophical without being philosophy. For example, there are now a fistful of novels about Wittgenstein, and it is difficult not to see them as being, in some sense, philosophical, since they take up, sometimes with considerable sophistication, what Wittgenstein thought or wrote; but no one thinks of these novels as works of philosophy in their own right. Likewise philosophical texts can be literary without being literature, especially when raising the question of how philosophy can or should be written (Irwin refers us to William James, but think of the audacity with which Stanley Cavell has recently pressed this question). Irwin’s point is that things have to be decided on a case-by-case basis. As the motto of art history has it, anything goes, but not everything is possible at every moment. It depends on how and where one is situated, and whether one’s position is fixed. As Stanley Cavell once said, to hear Schoenberg’s music as music, one has to change. Irwin treats Borges’ “Pierre Menard, Author of the Quixote” as philosophical “because it raises issues and asks questions that are of concern to philosophers” (p. 41); but Borges’ intentions may have been purely literary—although a purely literary intention, text, or work may be an empty abstraction or, at best, a limit-concept like Flaubert’s “book about nothing.”

This suggests that a sure-handed way of addressing the question of philosophy and literature would be from below, via literary history, which is Lois Parkinson Zamora’s approach in “Borges’s Monsters: Unnatural Wholes and the Transformation of Genre.” Zamora situates Borges in the literary culture of Argentina in the second and third decades of the last century. It is important to know that this is a philosophically-informed culture—Borges, for example, was a careful reader of both Miguel Unomuno and Ortega y Gasset—as well as a culture that sought to differentiate itself both from its own native literary traditions and from European forms of avant-garde experiment and provocation. Thus Borges’ ultraísmo was a literary movement that, in contrast to Surrealism, took the thought-experiment rather than the dream as the model of the work of art. As a modernist Borges breaks with realism, but he does so by using the conventions and strategies of realism to create monsters—creatures and states of affairs composed of irreconcilable parts, where the whole (just to call it that) is described in such empirical detail that it becomes absolutely singular, refractory to categories, a species unto itself, as if unmediated by an ideality: in short, an aliquid (like the “literary philosopher”). Zamora considers the monster to be the basic unit of Borges’ art. Borges’ stories frequently take the form of forged documents—essays, memoirs, histories, letters, testimonies, reports, inventories, anecdotes, narratives of ratiocination, book reviews, lists, biographical sketches, editions of manuscripts—that refer to fantastic states of affairs with a Stoic imperturbability, as if nothing in experience, however bizarre, could be surprising. So, documentary realism becomes the medium of what Zamora refers to as Borges’ “magical idealism.” In an elegant essay, “Mimesis and Modernism: The Case of Jorge Luis Borges,” Anthony Cascardi gives us a comparable analysis. Borges is a modernist who does not reject mimesis but rather recovers its more archaic, magical, anyhow pre-Aristotelian form in which, as in the story “Tlön, Uqbar, Orbis Tertius,” nothing is more real than a possible world, if only because possible worlds are carnivorous with respect to real ones. (Possibility is always near to madness: consider the paranoia of the android syndrome—if my old friend turns out to be an automaton, then what am I?)

A highly durable commonplace is that philosophy is dogmatic, authoritarian, rule-governed—”the guardian of rationality” (Habermas), whereas literature is parodic, ironic, satirical, anarchic, and supportive (as in Mikhail Bakhtin’s analysis) of a culture of misrule that protects ordinary people from the serious, straightforward, law-like word. As Richard Rorty would say, for plain folks freedom is often better than truth. The essays in this volume work hard to make philosophy look a little more loose and baggy than it officially is. Thus Elizabeth Millán-Zaibert situates Italo Calvino against the background of the German romantics, who did a very good job of making philosophy comic, ironic, satirical, and liberating—a view of German romanticism recovered recently by a number of philosophers: Jean-Luc Nancy, Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe, Stanley Cavell, Manfred Frank, and Richard Rorty. As Millán-Zaibert shows, Calvino helps to remind us that comedy, irony, and a genius for turning the world upside-down are virtues that philosophers have always shared with poets, novelists, and theater-folk. An upside-down world clears the mind. It is useful to know that Calvino was one of the foremost members of OuLiPo, the Workshop of Potential Literature, a group of European and American writers and intellectuals (many of them mathematicians) who tried to introduce new structures into literature, not by way of the aleatory methods of such avant-garde movements as Dada, Surrealism, or John Cage, but by the application of systematic constraints, as in Georges Perec’s La Disparition, a three-hundred page novel that does not contain the letter e. One could make the argument that Calvino, Perec, and other Oulipouvians like Raymond Queneau and Harry Mathews, are busy trying to guard rationality against appropriation (and reduction) by philosophers like Habermas.

Just so, in “The Writing of the System: Borges’s Library and Calvino’s Traffic,” Henry Sussman gives us Twelve Ways of Looking at a System, in the bargain parodying the concept of system, which (he argues) is how Borges and Calvino go about constructing their fictions, which tend to be little machines for producing logical, cognitive, or ontological disturbances. Calvino’s When On a Winter’s Night a Traveler is a self-interrupting novel made up of ten interrupted novels that somehow open on to one another to suggest a vast system of unfinished interlocking narratives whose center is everywhere and whose circumference is purely theoretical. Borges’s “The Library of Babel” imagines the universe as a library of infinitely extended galleries whose volumes contain all possible combinations of the twenty-odd orthographical symbols, which means that somewhere on its shelves is a text of the review you are now reading (or anyhow which I am now writing). In “Knowledge and Cognitive Practices in Eco’s Labyrinths of Intertextuality,” Rocco Capozzi examines, among other things, Eco’s insight that the history of writing (including philosophy, literature, law, etc.) is structured rhizomatically, like crabgrass. The relationship between literature and philosophy may not always be mutually illuminating, but on the crabgrass theory you can’t get rid of the one without uprooting the other. Meanwhile labyrinths, mirrors, echoes, complex systems (those ruled by butterflies), and performative contradictions are just some of the basic structures of what Wladimir Kyrsinski, in “Borges, Calvino, Eco: The Philosophies of Metafiction,” calls “the hermeneutical infinite,” as in Borges’s “Garden of the Forking Paths,” which is about a novel in which whatever could happen does happen within “an infinite series of times [that] embraces every possibility.”

Finally, in “Philosophy and Literature in Calvino’s Tales,” Ermanno Bencivenga reads Calvino’s fiction as a special instance of literary estrangement, where making something strange is a way of objectifying it, lifting it out of the oblivion to which everyday experience consigns it and thereby connecting us up with reality at the level of singular and irreducible details. This method of detail parallels but differs crucially from philosophy’s way of distancing us from things in order to grasp what is essential about them. For Bencivenga, this suggests a distinction between two ways of arriving at truth. Literature’s way is to tell as many stories as possible—to tell, ideally, all possible stories, leaving nothing unspoken, unremarked, unseen or unknown. Alternatively, “one can attempt to tell the truth…by saying very little and claiming it to be all that matters—all that is relevant” (p. 216). For the poet there are never enough stories, whereas for the philosopher there are always too many.

It’s a rare volume of conference papers that doesn’t have a clinker in it, but each of the essays in this book is well-crafted, rich in interesting ideas, and deeply informed about the (often difficult) literature it investigates. I’m not sure I’ve seen philosophy and literature, those hoary old adversaries, brought together in a more fruitful and satisfying way.