Literature, Life, and Modernity

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Richard Eldridge, Literature, Life, and Modernity, Columbia University Press, 2008, 178pp., $32.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780231144544.

Reviewed by Robert Pippin, University of Chicago



In Literature, Life, and Modernity Richard Eldridge focuses on the question of a reader's or a viewer's response to a literary or dramatic work in a specific historical epoch ("modernity"). That is, in contrast with many other philosophical approaches to literature, he avoids fixing attention on any putative doctrinal (moral or political or diagnostic) claims in a literary work. Thereby, and in many other admirable ways, he avoids the danger of treating literature as philosophy manqué, concedes the distinctness of literary experience, and only then asks about the significance of this experience. (In this way his approach is reminiscent to some extent of Schiller's; not bad company to be keeping.) This all amounts to a philosophy of literature of sorts,[1] but avoids a forced "philosophy in literature" or "literature as philosophy" treatment. There are themes and ideas at stake of course, but for distinct historical reasons, Eldridge also thinks of what he generally calls "modern" literature as characterized precisely by the absence of any thematic resolution, and so by a kind of play of possibilities, unsettledness, even homelessness. But, he argues, this is a play of ambiguity that nevertheless (and here the first controversial aesthetic claim) invites and sustains a compelling, valuable attentiveness, an attentiveness and involvement that (and here the second controversial philosophical claim) can be said also to inspire or provoke or in some way lead to this kind of attentiveness and involvement in, simply stated, life. (I should note too that this approach means that Eldridge has focused much more, though not exclusively, on issues of figuration and poetry, and not narrative. The latter is much more important for interpreters who take the fate suffered by characters in a narration as evidence of philosophical judgment. Eldridge's account of poetic figuration, even in dramas like Stoppard's and novels like Sebald's, allows him to stay much closer to a genuinely literary response, and that seems to me all to the good.)

Let me first state more carefully the three cornerstones of Eldridge's position: (i) the unique and unprecedented historical condition that he thinks we face, "modernity"; (ii) the unique historical response summoned up by "modern literature"; and (iii) the value -- not the moral or political value, but something like the existential value -- of such a responsiveness for what is simply called "life." Modernity, Literature, and Life, then; as in his title, but re-arranging things a bit.

(i) Modernity. Eldridge's characterization of the uniquely modern predicament is quite a high altitude overview and could I think be fairly summarized as a deeply romantic one, skeptical of the claims of the social and historical promises of the Enlightenment, and somewhat nostalgic or at least rueful about the loss of the premodern world (when there was, presumably, community, meaning, stability, purpose and so forth). It might thus be said to include such examples as Hegel's in his Differenzschrift, Hölderlin's sense of modernity as loss, and even such positions as Nietzsche's and Heidegger's, as well as Eldridge's own literary examples, the most important of which is Wordsworth. Modernity for Eldridge is characterized by (and here just a string of typical remarks) the fact that "competitive individualism or competitive factionalism comes to the fore, and chances of learning to live out a common humanity with more depth become increasingly attenuated." (4) The "inabilities of cultures to settle on specific, clear, final narrative arcs" is mentioned (10). The familiar dissociation of sensibilities is on view, and the "conflict" between "the claims of the sensible" and "the claims of the intelligible" gets a mention. (7-8) "Stability, depth, and lived meaningfulness founder." (Ibid) Science is said to have brought about "a radically novel conception of physical nature and of our relation to it" and this famous "disenchantment" means that "things of the physical world and the moral realm have fallen apart," (29) and this means again a loss of common purpose or any possible reassurance about what we take to be important or significant. The loss of any commonality means that the chances of great "skepticism" arising about the worth of any particular pursuit are much greater "in modernity" (107). The historical experience of the twentieth and twenty-first centuries has made "the prospects for a shared life of right … seem dimmer yet." (123) And Eric Santner's characterization is endorsed, that "the damage continually wrought on and by (male) subjects [they both mean in the standard psychoanalytic Totemism and Taboo story of parricide and primal repression] is then exacerbated by life in modern commodity society, which displays a [quoting Santner] 'paradoxical mixture of deadness and excitation, stuckness and agitation … a nihilistic vitality and … surplus excitation and agitation.'" (131)[2] At one particularly pessimistic point, Eldridge's gloss on "modern" is simply "materialist, competitive, value-denigrating individualism that destroys all circuits of the mimesis of response [an Adorno-esque turn of phrase that I am not sure I understand] and so destroys the very life of subjectivity as such." (25) At another rather gloomy point we hear about "the conditions of empty materiality and ossified conventionality in which distinctly human powers are mostly betrayed." (82) In general, Eldridge seems friendly enough to quite a broad range of formulations well known since the start of the nineteenth century skepticism about the Enlightenment project and the rapidly changing bourgeois world: that is, fragmentation, or in Hegel's famous formulation, Zerissenheit, torn-apartness; but also disenchantment, anomie, materialist consumerism, self-satisfied individualism, the reification of social relations, "all that is solid melts in the air," nihilism, colonization of the life world, identity-thinking, loss of aura, one-dimensionality and so forth. By now the list is a very long one.

I mentioned that this characterization is largely romantic in spirit, but let me stress that this is also true of the selection and treatment of literature in the book. I mean that Eldridge is not as much interested in the vexing category question of the differences among simply modern (and largely romantic and late romantic), modernist, and postmodernist literature. For him the important and very comprehensive covering category for his purposes is simply "modern." Here is his summary claim.

Hence in either form -- relatively modern-modernist or relatively postmodern -- what modern literature knows is that no comprehensive resolution of crises within individual or social development is possible; some satisfaction must be found within the working of the work itself, as a kind of placeholder for what is never achieved. Human beings, at least within the orbit of a modern individualism that remains powerfully with us, persist as caught up in signifying stresses [a phrase of Eric Santner's that I'm also not sure about] arising out of a sense of slippage of 'inner,' passionate, embodied archaic selfhood away from 'outer,' articulated social role and agency. In modernity such slippage is inevitable, and the task of literature is more to figure its forms than to propose standing resolutions." (10)[3]

Now there are often good reasons for pressing various somewhat disparate phenomena together but this kind of modern-modernist-postmodernist jumble misses an opportunity for a deeper discussion. What distinguishes much modern-romantic from modernist literature and art is that by the time of the latter, the various anxieties, forms of spiritual suffering and grave doubts about modern progressivism that Eldridge points to had turned into a reflective crisis for the arts themselves; that is, a crisis concerning their own possibility and value, and their possible relation to any audience. The extraordinary confluence of symbolist (or linguistically materialist) poetry, intricately self-reflexive and even self-parodying and certainly self-undermining novels, ever less representational and ever more abstract and "painterly" painting, the move towards absolute music (or pure sonority; sound just as sound, not as expressive or representational) and eventually modernist film, drawing attention to itself as film, as artifice (perhaps biased, unreliable artifice), rather than as transparently representational, all these comprise a quite distinct phase of modern art as such. It might have been valuable to separate out such examples and consider them separately because many of them make very improbable Eldridge's account of the function of literature in modernity, a function I take to be broadly therapeutic, and with which I will disagree.

(ii) The Literary Response. So what is his account of that therapeutic function? Here again are some representational claims. Eldridge treats literature as what he calls a "compensation" (7) for the kinds of losses that he has characterized as typical of Western modernization. The nature of this compensation begins to take shape early in his book. Whatever typically modern "losses and crises" are apparent in a literary work, a great work can nonetheless compel us "to become absorbed in them, to follow their self-sustaining work without taking away any formulable-assertable message about reality outside the work." (7) (A brief demurral here. The internal logic of these formulations is not entirely clear to me. If we are provoked or stimulated to an attentiveness to and absorption in what are characterized as losses and crises, and we carry no "resolution" away, then it is not obvious that such increased attention (to loss and crisis) could be in any way a consolation or a "working through" of perplexity, rather than a depressing deepening of it. Perhaps the point is that there is something better about attending to and dwelling on the catastrophe, and not hiding it from ourselves? We get a general characterization of literature early on that grounds much of what is later said. "But literature is also a form of thinking[[4]] that uses concepts in order to seek orientation in life under forms of emplotment [sic] and in order to work through perplexity." (17) So what we want "in modernity" is "greater fullness of orientation, resolution of perplexity, and clarity and adequacy of feeling," and literature is said to be a "central form of the pursuit of such possibilities." (17-18) (I hope the distinct and quite different problem of modernist art is already clear in this context. I doubt whether anyone has ever finished a short story by Kleist, or Musil's novel, or a piece of Beckett's short fiction or come from a Pinter play with "greater fullness of orientation, resolution of perplexity, and clarity and adequacy of feeling." Just the opposite; perhaps the exact opposite in such cases.) The notions of intense attentiveness, absorption, heightened interest and what is called "increased fluency, clarity, coherence and felt aptness of orientation" (18) are mentioned throughout in various ways. Other important terms: "fullness of attention, a structure of care, reflection and investment in activity," "increased life" (99) or a "fuller, more animated, more ensouled life" (114); literary experience is called "deeply absorbing, cathartic, yet contingency-acknowledging workings through of experience." (119 Here is the most sweeping and summary statement of the Eldridge position.

The achievement of further understanding coupled with strengthened and purified affections, with both understanding and affections then discharged in a dense, medium-specific performance of working through, in which a point of view is made manifest and recognition and like-mindedness are successfully solicited, is what I have elsewhere called the achievement of expressive freedom. (109)

Such claims raise the obvious questions: is this what makes up the meaning and the value of "literature" and "literary experience," and what does this experience have to do with anything else in life, in "real life" as students sometimes ask.

(iii) Literature as Life. Eldridge has an ambitious answer to the latter of these questions. He treats the capacity of literature to compel interest and attentiveness in it as of a piece with and, as greatly helping to sustain, our capacity to attend to and meaningfully cope with, life itself.

We are able to achieve, and we are to achieve, not final moral knowledge, but rather a certain kind of more fluent, clearer, more formed, more focused, and more articulate stance or address to or in life. (15)


Through such fullness of attention, a structure of care, reflection and investment in activity is achieved. So that we lead more freely and fully the lives of persons or selves who take an interest in their worlds, rather than being buffeted about by experience received only passively and inchoately. (23)

Poetry is said to help "overcome" the modern situation (which is said to be "a kind of ethical death in life" or failed subjectivity) by "undertaking to reanimate our wholeheartedness, interest, commitment in our lives from within the broken, half-hearted feelings we already have." (80) At one point, in testimony to the densely inter-textual way Eldridge's readings are built up in conversation with a great deal of secondary literature, he relies on a suggestion by Eric Santner, prompted by a reading by Terry Eagelton of Walter Benjamin, to get us to the point of appreciating how to "detect in the decline of the aura the form of new social and libidinal relations, realizable by revolutionary practice." (133)[5]

I think something is going wrong in the direction of these latter remarks (what "revolutionary practice"? and how would it produce "new social and libidinal relations"?) and I want to say it stems from both the abstractness of the treatment and an interpretation of literature and literary experience as therapeutic.


Eldridge's conception of modernity in his book is bleak, even relentlessly catastrophic, and it is this dire historical condition that prompts the literary "compensations" Eldridge is interested in. This means that it is also an undialectical notion and borders sometimes a bit on a caricature, the sort of thing that pops up in Woody Allen's "Russian nihilist" speeches in many of his movies. But it is a short book and one can't do everything in fine detail. My problem concerns the content of the claims about the provocation and the response. First, it is not clear to me how important the category of modernity is for Eldridge, despite appearances that it is of vital importance, that we are in an unprecedented and unprecedentedly dangerous new situation. It rather appears that in his view the situation to which literature is supposed to be a response is always dire. I say this because in Chapter Four, in a discussion of Greek tragedy, Shakespeare, and Nietzsche, the historical category doesn't seem to matter at all, and all the authors are treated more like contemporaries who all accept "the destructiveness and cruelty of human life." (72) Eldridge agrees with (what he claims to be) Nietzsche's claim that

Antigone and Oedipus, Hamlet and Lear, are figures of sublime accomplishment, Nietzsche is arguing, in standing out for us intelligibly from the chaos of life in the coherence and power of their thought, diction, and action. They have lived as subjects of their lives, experiences, and actions rather than as mere things, in a way that is both exemplary and comforting for us. (74)

Apparently there is some important distinction for Eldridge between the chaos and threat to meaning wrought by modern individualism and consumerism and that wrought by an ancient sense of the destructiveness and cruelty of life, but since they both, according to him, require the same sort of "literary consolation," I can't see any point in insisting on such a distinction. (All of this is not to mention that I myself find very little exemplary and comforting about the fate of Lear or Hamlet or even the fanatical and near suicidal Antigone. Is there a more remorseless, devastating, unredeemed ending in all of literature than the death of Cordelia and Lear's broken heart?)

Even when he wants to point out the variety of "the historical crises and losses that provoke literary attention," he nevertheless generalizes and points to what he explicitly calls a "permanent human immigrancy or fracturedness" (my emphasis), and he quotes Santner again on what is called the "signifying stress at the core of creaturely life." (7)[6] So perhaps we could hear some more about a concept of modernity that ranges from nineteenth century England to the world of Stoppard and Sebald and more about whether there is anything specifically modern about modern literature in response to such a condition.

And I cannot find a stable notion of consolation or affirmation -- whether "increased life" or greater attentiveness or heightened interest or exemplary agency -- that is common to the variety of authors Eldridge discusses. Like notions of fluency and absorption and working through perplexity, these are very loose, elusive terms. Perhaps they have to be at this level, but I found myself losing hold of them. And I can easily call to mind many poems by Eliot, or Larkin, or Berryman, or novels by Musil or Camus and so forth where the introduction of any notion of satisfaction or consolation would have to count as some sort of joke. Whatever your anxiety or melancholy about modernity, you can be pretty sure that, after reading many works by these and many other authors, it will be worse. (This goes again to the issue of whether Eldridge is giving us a "philosophy of literature," a "philosophy of modern literature," or a philosophy of "just the literature he is interested in.")

Finally, all of these reconciliatory and consolatory notions are so abstract and elusive that it is hard to see why such attentiveness and heightened or increased life just in themselves would be a valuable thing. In the words of another commentator in another context, "When the Unabomber, alone in his mountain fastness, reads Joseph Conrad's The Secret Agent, with its suggestive account of a retarded boy blown to bits, his heart flutters in sympathy, just like that of a Bryn Mawr teenager."[7] (For "flutters in sympathy" just substitute, "feels his life intensified" or "has his interest in life heightened.")

Let me finally turn to the issue of the therapeutic function of literature and let us agree immediately on two clear issues. First, who could deny that in some contexts, at some periods, with some literary works, some readers might experience a renewed attention to, or wholehearted involvement with, their life and life in general as a result of reading some works? We have very little idea how it is that a great deal that once mattered could suddenly cease to matter, how the structure of desire that sustained our interest and involvement could fail and sometimes fail catastrophically, and so there is no reason to argue that it is impossible that a literary experience might re-animate such failed desire. (Of course the frustrating thing about such a phenomenon is that you can neither argue someone out of it nor effect some literary cure, feeding them Wordsworth, Stoppard, Rilke and Sebald. I'm not suggesting Eldridge is proposing such a clinic; the only problem I have is with Eldridge's characterization of "modern literature as such," especially given what seems to me the predominance of "alienation-effects," de-familiarization, dystopian, and opaque, dense literature in modernity that all call mostly for heavy interpretive work, providing little in the way of satisfaction or consolation, resulting mostly in confusion not clarity, and in disorientation.

Secondly, let us agree that a purist position on the arts, on the absolute autonomy of art, l'art pour l'art, and so forth is extreme and quite implausible. The philosopher whose account of the fine arts I find the most valuable, Hegel, regarded the arts as indispensable modes of human self-knowledge, and so also defended a functionalist and to some extent a cognitivist position on the arts. Some of his better known and clearly romantically-inspired, or Hölderlin-intoxicated formulations intersect with Eldridge's on the question of "life." For example from the Introduction to the Phenomenology of Spirit:

The course of studies of the ancient world is distinct from that of modern times in that the ancient course of studies consisted in a thoroughgoing cultivation of natural consciousness. Experimenting particularly with each part of its existence and philosophizing about everything it came across, the ancient course of studies fashioned itself into an altogether active universality. In contrast, in modern times, the individual finds the abstract form ready-made. The strenuous effort to grasp it and make it his own is more of an unmediated drive to bring the inner to the light of day; it is the truncated creation of the universal rather than the emergence of the universal from out of the concrete, from out of the diversity found within existence. Nowadays the task before us consists not so much in purifying the individual of the sensuously immediate and in making him into a thinking substance which has itself been subjected to thought; it consists to an even greater degree in doing the very opposite. It consists in actualizing and spiritually animating the universal by means of the sublation of fixed and determinate thoughts. (¶33)[8]

This passage dovetails from another, much later in Hegel's career, from his Berlin lectures on fine art.

[Art's] aim therefore is supposed to consist in awakening [wecken] and vivifying [beleben] our slumbering feelings, inclinations, and passions of every kind, in filling the heart, in forcing the human being, whether educated or not, to go through the whole gamut of feelings which the human heart in its inmost and secret recesses can bear, experience and produce, through what can move and stir the human breast in its depth and manifold possibilities and aspects, and to deliver to feeling and contemplation for its enjoyment whatever spirit possesses of the essential and lofty in its thinking and in the Idea … [9]

But the differences with Eldridge are also manifest. Hegel wants a much more weighty and differentiated account of modern art (which means romantic art with him, especially the modern lyric) in its contrast with pre-modern; that is, an art that reflects the period in which human freedom has become the most important human ideal. Indeed Hegel has been credited with inspiring the historical approach to the visual arts, and it is clear from many other passages that the sort of self-knowledge he thinks is possible in the fine arts varies a great deal across human history, according to various more or less adequate understandings of the relation between sensibility and thought. Moreover, he adopts an orientation towards art that is decidedly unKantian and unusual.

That is, one of the things that distinguishes Hegel from many modern philosophers of art is his focus on the centrality of aesthetic content in his account of successful and especially great art. Contrary to post-Kantian formalism in philosophical aesthetics and criticism, for Hegel inadequate understanding of content (of the "Idea") = bad art. "Works of art are all the more excellent in expressing true beauty, the deeper is the inner truth of their content and thought."[10] The great enemy is indeterminacy, mere gestures at the beyond, or worshipful awe at the unsayable. Hence Hegel's hostility toward the sublime as regressive and his suggestion that the criterion of beauty as the chief aesthetic ideal has become outmoded in modernity, largely irrelevant.

The point of introducing the Hegelian position here is that it reminds us that we cannot understand the function of a literary work in a social world, or as philosophically illuminating, or even in Eldridge's case, in a very general "existential" sense, unless we address the issue of who, in what sort of community, can be said to be reconciled to, or interested anew in, or more flexibly and nimbly comprehending what, and when. All of that does not depend on the kind or quality of the literature in question, but on the kind and character of the life at issue, and, as Hegel reminds us, at some points such a form of life comes simply to be unlivable and literature and the arts are little more than an expression of this irreconcilability. Now Eldridge provides us interpretations of specific works, but as far as I could tell, they all end up somehow manifesting the virtues of expressive freedom in a way too indeterminate to serve as the basis of a philosophy of modern literature.

This seems to me, anyway, the relevance of the Hegelian approach, its challenge to any substantive aesthetics concerned, like Eldridge's, with not just the formal characteristics of the aesthetic object and aesthetic experience, but with, broadly understood, their meaning and significance, why they matter; all of this in contrast with the somewhat cartoonish philosopher of absolute reconciliation with which Eldridge opens his last chapter. Hegel, I think, brings us down to earth, to Wirklichkeit, in other words, in aesthetics as in other areas, and his approach is much to be preferred to Benjamin's endless reminders that we are not God (alright already), odes to our finitude (how many times can such reminders continue to have any bite or grip on us?), or even the elegiac beauty of Sebald. Put one final way, consider this summary remark by Eldridge, after his sensitive reading of Sebald's story from The Emigrants, "Paul Bereyter." Eldridge wants to contrast what we would get from a philosophical or theological or political or historical account of Bereyter's life with the literary account we have just read.

But something nonetheless would be missed in them: the intimate detail and density of consciousness and its movements in perception, as it finds itself now in this situation, now in that, struck by surprises and intensities that seem to resist full capture by either essential descriptions or subsumptive generalizations. A task of literature … is to render some of these movements for our identification, thus enabling us, along with their narrators (and writers) to work them through, so as to be all at once ourselves, in our particular personalities, loneliness, and intensities of perception and recollection, and also in the world, able, in the end, to let it go its own way, with an appropriate sense of mystery and wonder at it, and at how one has been in it, but not quite, ever altogether of it. (147)

All of this, I want to say, depends a good deal more on the character of the life we are being invited to lead or recollect or understand and those possibilities, whether we can work anything through, can really abide "letting a life go its own way," whether our sense of mystery is appropriate, and so forth, is not an incidental or merely contextualizing adjunct to literary work or criticism. It is the heart of it. If we want to appreciate these possibilities in the late modern West, and think that the aesthetic expression of these possibilities is a useful mode of inquiry, we will have to know a good deal more about the character of such a late modernity and a good deal more about just what such a "working through" involves.

[1] I say "of sorts" because, as will become more prominent later, I am not sure how to summarize the ambition of Eldridge's book. A good deal of it seems to aspire to be a philosophical account of the significance of modern literature as such (sometimes, as in Chapter Four, of literature as such); but there are many places it seems consciously restricted to a philosophical account of the literature he happens to mention and only that literature. See for example his comments on Sebald, where a sentence reads, "A task of literature -- or at least of this kind of intensely lyrical and elegiac literature …"

[2] Eldridge is quoting Eric Santer's On Creaturely Life (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2006).

[3] I note here, with respect to the issue mentioned in the first footnote, the unqualified sweep of the phrases "modern literature" and "modernity" in this passage.

[4] Note again the unqualified reference to literature as such.

[5] Again, Santner's On Creaturely Life is being cited.

[6] Again, creaturely life as such; not modern existence.

[7] The line is from Geoffrey Harpham's justly famous essay on Martha Nussbaum, "Criticism as Therapy: The Hunger of Martha Nussbaum," in The Character of Criticism (New York: Routledge, 2006), p. 64.

[8] I am citing the on-line translation made available by Terry Pinkard at

[9] Hegel's Aesthetics: Lectures on Fine Art, (LFA hereafter) transl. T.M. Knox (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1975), vol. I, p. 46.

[10] LFA, p. 74. Cf. also what Hegel says in the Encyclopedia, §562A.