Living Christianly: Kierkegaard's Dialectic of Christian Existence

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Sylvia Walsh, Living Christianly: Kierkegaard's Dialectic of Christian Existence, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2005, 216pp, $49.50 (hbk), ISBN 0271026871

Reviewed by Steven M. Emmanuel, Virginia Wesleyan College


There are two kinds of secondary literature about Kierkegaard. The first is written by those whose main interests lie outside Kierkegaard studies. For these authors, Kierkegaard is a useful foil for addressing problems in the various sub-fields of philosophical research. Notable examples of this approach can be found in the writings of Philip Quinn, Alasdair MacIntyre, and Jacques Derrida. The other kind of secondary literature represents a deeper sort of engagement with Kierkegaard's thought in its totality. These authors typically have some knowledge of Danish, and they are sensitive to the historical and cultural context within which Kierkegaard lived and wrote. Though they may be interested in the larger philosophical or theological or literary issues addressed in Kierkegaard's writings, their main purpose is to present a more complete and accurate account of his thought. Sylvia Walsh's latest book, Living Christianly: Kierkegaard's Dialectic of Christian Existence, is a fine example of this latter approach.

It is well known that Kierkegaard regarded himself as a religious author whose chief task was to clarify the conceptual and existential requirements of Christian faith. Though Kirkegaard's authorial motivation has been questioned by some scholars, most have accepted his account of it as a working assumption in their interpretations of the authorship. It might seem odd, therefore, that the majority of synoptic studies that appeared in the twentieth century tended to focus primarily on the aesthetic and philosophical writings of 1843-46, giving comparatively little attention to Kierkegaard's later and more straightforwardly Christian works. Walsh's study concentrates exclusively on this so-called "second literature," which comprises the works written between 1847 and 1851. She does so not merely to shed light on a portion of the authorship that has been neglected, but because she believes that an understanding of these religious writings is necessary to a more complete and accurate account of Kierkegaard's view of what it means to live as a Christian.

A key distinction at the heart of the second literature (and Walsh's book) is that which Kierkegaard draws between a "conceptual" and an "existential" dialectic. Kierkegaard actually has a lot to say about the former in his pseudonymous writings. In Concluding Unscientific Postscript, for example, Climacus attempts to recover the original meanings of central Christian concepts and distinguish them from their speculative counterfeits. But according to Walsh, it is only in the later religious works that we get a full picture of the existential dialectic of Christian inwardness, of what it means to appropriate Christian concepts in such a way that one's life becomes an expression of them.

Briefly stated, the existential dialectic is shown to be "informed by a peculiar dialectical method and character which Kierkegaard identifies as 'inverse dialectic' (omvendt dialektik) or 'the dialectic of inversion' (Omventhedens Dialektik)" [7]. According to this dialectic, the positive ideals of Christianity, such as faith, hope, joy and consolation, are always qualified by the negative determinants of Christian existence. The essentially Christian form of life is marked by the consciousness of sin, sacrifice, self-denial, poverty, suffering, and adversity. According to Kierkegaard, the believer must neither seek to avoid these nor to give in to them entirely, but rather to understand that it is only through these negative conditions that one can experience the true nature of divine grace and give proper expression to the positive ideals of Christianity.

According to Kierkegaard, the great "calamity of Christendom" is that it abolishes this dialectic, and with it the emphasis on the negative aspects of Christian existence. In this way, Christendom not only removes the rigorousness and difficulty of being a Christian, but at the same time removes the very possibility of living Christianly. In response to this situation, Kierkegaard undertakes to "reintroduce Christianity into Christendom" by calling attention once again to the decisive categories of Christianity.

Of course, it is not enough merely to have the correct conceptual understanding. This must also be expressed or "reduplicated" in the life of the believer. Reduplication has a characteristically paradoxical form in Christianity, since it involves expressing one's relation to the eternal by "working against oneself" -- not in the sense in which one works against one's "true condition or goal" but in the sense that the inverted dialectical movement of faith "runs counter to ordinary human desires, values, and goals in life" [162]. This can be seen most clearly in the example of Christ, who is held up as the prototype for all Christian striving.

Kierkegaard is especially concerned to point out that Christ embodies both the positive and the negative ideals of Christianity. As the redeemer, Christ represents the forgiveness of sins, while as the lowly, suffering servant he represents the possibility of offense. In contrast to Christendom's one-dimensional representation of Christ as triumphant savior, Kierkegaard reminds us that "Christ himself willed to be the abased one, this was precisely how he wanted to be regarded. History, therefore, should not go to the trouble of letting him have his due, and we must not in ungodly thoughtlessness presumptuously delude ourselves that we immediately know who he was. No one knows that, and the person who believes it must become contemporary with him in his abasement" [Practice in Christianity, 33-34].

In the four main chapters of the book, the basic forms of this existential dialectic are presented in a series of conceptual pairings: Consciousness of sin/faith and forgiveness; the possibility of offense/faith; dying to the world and self-denial/new life, love and hope in the spirit; suffering/joy and consolation. In each case, Walsh demonstrates how the negative ideals qualify the positive and can be "regarded inversely as aids toward willing the good and as a source of strength and deeper insight into the nature of the eternal, life, love, hope, faith and selfhood" [150].

Walsh's study is a careful piece of scholarship. But even as it sheds light on Kierkegaard's understanding of the conceptual requirements of living Christianly, this study stands in an uneasy relation to the works it attempts to elucidate. As an author, Kierkegaard was always concerned with two things: the content of the writing and the form of its communication. One of the most characteristic features of his religious writings is the way he brings form and content together into a unified whole. Though we can separate these for scholarly treatment, we cannot do so without presenting the communication as something essentially different from what it is. This has direct consequences for our understanding of Kierkegaard's task as a religious author.

Walsh tells us that Kierkegaard's aim is "not to construct or systematize the qualifications of Christian existence, but simply to describe (at fremstille) them" [4]. By elucidating the decisive categories of Christianity, he seeks "to interest persons in learning what Christianity is in order that Christian existence might become an existential possibility for their lives" [5]. While there is no doubt that Kierkegaard is engaged in clarifying Christian concepts, albeit in an unsystematic fashion, it could still be argued that he is doing much more than merely descriptive work in at least some of the later writings.

In an unpublished preface to For Self Examination (1851), a work that figures prominently in Walsh's study, Kierkegaard writes: "At times I have considered laying down my pen and, if anything should be done, to use my voice. Meanwhile I came by way of further reflection to the realization that it perhaps is more appropriate for me … once again to use my pen but in a different way, as I would use my voice, consequently in direct address to my contemporaries, winning men, if possible." This observation, taken together with the title of the book, strongly suggests that Kierkegaard was attempting to do more than describe Christianity. At least in For Self Examination and Judge for Yourself!, he engages in a form of religious communication that directly aims at transforming the reader, or creating the existential conditions in which the reader may experience spiritual awakening.

We know from numerous entries in the Journals and Papers that Kierkegaard had a profound appreciation for the ethical and religious (spiritual) potential of the spoken word. He confides that he always wrote with an eye to being read aloud. But nowhere does this have more significance for him than in the religious writings, for which he even developed a unique style of punctuation to facilitate the reader's performance of the words in speech.

By creating the conditions for speech, the style of these writings reinforces the idea of a personal address, so that when the text is read aloud, the reader may experience that the words are speaking directly to him and to him alone. It is in this concrete temporal and historical situation of reading aloud that the "single individual," to whom the religious discourse is always addressed, can existentially appropriate the meaning of its words.

The importance of the spoken word is highlighted in the prefaces to both of the works mentioned. In For Self Examination, he writes: "My dear reader, read aloud, if possible! … By reading aloud you will gain the strongest impression that you have only yourself to consider, not me, who, after all, am 'without authority,' nor others, which would be a distraction." This injunction is repeated in the preface to Judge for Yourself!, where Kierkegaard explicitly characterizes his task as addressing the conscience of the reader. In both works he deliberately seeks to confront the "single individual" in a manner that forces a critical self-examination. By both speaking the truth and encouraging the reader to speak the truth out loud, he seeks to expose the illusion of Christendom, so that the reader can no longer feel "comfortable in the deception."

Conceptual clarification is certainly an important part of what Kierkegaard is trying to do in these religious writings. However, it is the manner in which these concepts are brought home to the reader that makes all the difference in whether or not he succeeds in his task as a religious author. Indeed, the form of this religious communication is crucial to understanding the scope and nature of that task.

An adequate discussion of the rhetorical strategies employed in the religious writings would take up an entire volume. Walsh can hardly be blamed for not delving into these issues in her book. What she does give us is a valuable contribution in its own right. She brings to her task a broad knowledge of the Kierkegaardian literature and an appreciation for the subtle nuances and complexity of Kierkegaard's conceptual vocabulary. Students of Kierkegaard will find her book immensely useful in their own attempts to make sense of the authorship.