Living Mirrors: Infinity, Unity, and Life in Leibniz's Philosophy

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Ohad Nachtomy, Living Mirrors: Infinity, Unity, and Life in Leibniz's Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2019, 219pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190907327.

Reviewed by Justin E. H. Smith, University of Paris


There are several billion microorganisms in a typical teaspoon of soil: not an infinite number, but more than any finite mind could hope to count one by one. Leibniz did not know the precise nature of soil microbes, nor did he have any empirical proof of their existence, but he was convinced that they, or something like them, must exist, and this for deep philosophical reasons. Whatever there is in the world must be underlain by real soul-like unities or centers of action and perception, analogous to whatever it is we are referring to when we speak of "me". But any such center of action must be outfitted with a body, and this body must be such that no amount of decomposition or removal of parts could ever take the being in question out of existence. Thus there is nothing in the physical world but what Leibniz called "organic bodies" or "natural machines", that is to say infinitely complex mechanical bodies. Considered together with the active, perceiving unities that underlie them, these organic bodies are best described as "corporeal substances", of which animals and plants are the varieties we here on the surface of the earth know best. Everything is alive, in short.

Leibniz got quite a bit right, though he was wrong about some of the details. There is for example a difference between the bacteria-rich soil of an agricultural field, an alkaline lake inhabited by only a few extremophiles, and the surface of Mars. Much of our own planet is teeming with life, but lifelessness is a real possibility too. Empirical microscopy has borne out Leibniz's suspicions about swamps, cheeses, and other microbe-rich environments, but even here there is no possible empirical corroboration of his conviction that visible organic bodies are in the end the bodies of simple substances, of immaterial nodes of action and perception. There is no possible empirical corroboration, because this conviction of Leibniz's is a priori. As Leibniz is inclined to say of the discoveries of the microscopists, he appreciates them, but they do not teach him anything he did not already believe for "higher reasons".

Ohad Nachtomy does not seek to assess Leibniz's theory of life in terms of how well it stands up by the standards of contemporary science, but rather within the aims and scope of Leibniz's philosophy as a whole. This means, most importantly, drawing out the full significance of Leibniz's importation into his theory of life of a concept borrowed from mathematics: the concept of infinity.

At first glance, infinity would seem to be of little help in making sense of the living world. Again, there are indeed a lot of micoorganisms, but an exhaustive census of their kind is at least in principle possible. Yet the interest for Leibniz is not only in enumerating a total number of individual living beings, which he does indeed suppose to be infinite. It is also in analyzing the composition of any given individual corporeal substance, which Leibniz also supposes to be infinite. And to say that an organic body is infinite, for him, is not only to say that there is no end to the number of divisions that might be made in it, but, much more strongly, that it is already actually infinitely divided. This is a radical move to make, overturning in important respects the entire previous history of the concept of infinity: from a notion whose privative prefix in- was taken seriously, as designating a potential process that could never be brought to an end, to, now, the notion of a principle that is actually constitutive of reality, that needs to be invoked in order to truly understand the nature of the world around us, and every single thing in it. Nachtomy writes: "far from avoiding infinity, as others recommend, Leibniz seems to take infinity to be indispensable for an adequate description of nature" (9).

The present reviewer wrote a book about Leibniz's account of living beings (a book accurately and rigorously discussed in Nachtomy's book) and there defended an account of the work that infinity did in Leibniz's account as amounting to a sort of "fudge factor". Earlier mechanical philosophers had struggled to account for the fact that, though animal bodies are machines, they nonetheless do so much more than the rough metal, wooden, and glass contraptions that we design. They reintroduced various form-like powers in natural bodies that they sometimes acknowledged they did not themselves fully understand: notably, Descartes attributed many vital functions to "fermentation"; Robert Boyle, who was the first to explicitly identify as a "mechanical philosopher", allowed the notion of textura to do the work that irreducible qualities might do for a non-mechanical philosopher. Leibniz was wary of allowing spirit-like forces in through the back door, as it were, in the explanation of the bodies of living beings, and he was quick to denounce the solutions that other mechanical philosophers provided as so many poorly disguised plastic natures, or to use one of his preferred expressions, as so many je-ne-sais-quoi's. Leibniz insisted he could get by without any such principle, and that he was able to do so because he came to understand, after trying out and then abandoning some alternative models, that what is truly special about the mechanical bodies of living beings is not that they are hydraulico-pneumatic, or fermentative, or any one of the many alternative options, but because they are characterized by an infinitely complex structure, that the machine bodies of living animals are the machines that remain machines ad infinitum. To say that infinity is a fudge factor for Leibniz is to say that it is really only doing the work for him here that, e.g., fermentation does for Descartes. But one of the great achievements of Nachtomy's work is that it shows why one is wrong to suppose this, i.e., implicitly, and gently, why I was wrong.

Nachtomy's progress in the interpretation of Leibniz -- by which I mean his significant advancement of our understanding of what Leibniz believed towards something fairly close to a true understanding -- results from his approach to the question of life in Leibniz as inextricably linked to the question of infinity. Leibniz was moreover working on these problems as interlinked nearly from the beginning of his career. Nachtomy's book is the first study of Leibniz ever to show clearly and convincingly that when in the 1690s the philosopher eventually comes to propose his theory of the structure of natural beings as machines within machines to infinity, he is in fact building on a long concern to understand and master the mathematics of the infinitely large and the infinitely small. Leibniz's introduction of infinity into his philosophical reflection on life, in other words, is not a fudge factor, nor a loose appropriation of a metaphor from one field into another field where it has no real explanatory power. Rather, his mature theory of living beings emerges directly out of his earliest and most productive contributions in mathematics, particularly during his sojourn in Paris from 1672 to 1676, and his efforts there to distinguish between different kinds of infinity in the course of his work on the infinitesimal calculus. When Leibniz injects the concept of infinity into the theory of life, he does so in the belief that this is a concept of which he has true mastery, and therefore one that can do real theoretical work for him. This is therefore the opposite of a fudge factor. Even if Leibniz is wrong -- as he is, given that there is indeed a lower limit to the structural complexity not just of living beings, but of physical reality -- nonetheless his theory of life is what we may call a "mature" one, which is to say not one that is put forward as a stop-gap measure in the absence of knowledge the theorist himself recognizes to be necessary.

Chapter 1 summarizes the key characters and conceptual problems to be treated in the book. Chapters 2 through 4 discuss Leibniz's early engagement with the problem of infinity in mathematics and theology, particularly in Paris and in his productive encounter with the work of Spinoza, Pascal, and Arnauld. In chapter 5 Nachtomy pivots to the connnection between infinity and life in Leibniz, while chapters 6 through 10 each go on to develop some aspect or other of this connection. A separate Conclusion reflects on Leibniz's unified account of infinity and life as part of a strategy on the philosopher's part to "re-enchant nature".

Chapter 6 is particularly useful for understanding the various meanings of the idea of "machine" in Leibniz, as well as the conceptual pair of "the natural" and "the artificial". Here Nachtomy suggests that we may understand Leibniz's claim that an organic body "remains a machine in its least parts" in two ways: either structural or functional. On the former account, "what extends to infinity is not the number of organs or machines, but, rather, the whole structure of a natural machine" (124). Here, the infinite structure of an organic body is not a matter of the containment of machines within machines, but rather is more like a fractal, which is to say "a structure defined by a unique rule of generation, whose continuous application produces an infinite structure, such that each of its parts has the same structure as the whole" (125). This approach is contrasted with the one Nachtomy calls "functional", according to which for a machine to remain a machine in its least parts is "for each of its parts to contribute to the end of the whole machine by performing a certain function" (131), and this to infinity. It does not seem clear that these two accounts are incompatible or even in tension with one another. What makes the organic subsystems of my feet for example part of the overall functioning of my entire organic body seems to have something to do, for Leibniz, with the fact that they are with the program, as we say today, of whatever it is that makes my body my body. One of the most compelling ways Leibniz has to account for this is in terms of a pars pro toto principle. This is the same principle that makes regeneration of limbs possible in some lower species (which Leibniz likely had not observed), a power of which our own bodies' capacity to spontaneously heal when wounded is but a somewhat less spectacular instance (which Leibniz, like every human being in history, definitely observed).

The structural account would seem to imply the principle of pars pro toto, which in turn would seem to underlie the functional account. So it is not entirely clear why Nachtomy seeks to separate the two of them from one another. He prefers the former as an interpretation of Leibniz's position, and somewhat loosely, but nonetheless intriguingly, identifies it as an anticipation in Leibniz of the idea of the fractal. (Leibniz did reflect on the idea of "recursive self-similarity", but did not discern a viable way to treat it in geometry.) The cover of the book even features a lovely photograph, by Nachtomy, of a head of Romanesco broccoli, whose buds branch into meristems forming logarithmic spirals. But of course not everything in nature has this form (consider, for example, regular broccoli or cauliflower, the comparable parts of which form not into spirals but amorphous "curds"), and even in this one remarkable case the fractals are only approximate, since they terminate fairly quickly. But in order for the structural account of natural machines to be fully compelling, the fractal nature of the organic body would need to be fully realized, and not approximate, and this is something that Leibniz seems to believe it must be, for reasons far deeper than any empirical investigation of any particualr species of vegetable could reveal.

One might take issue with Nachtomy's concluding interpretation of Leibniz's theory of life as an attempt to "re-enchant nature" in the wake of its disenchantment by first-generation mechanical philosophers such as Descartes. After all, Leibniz insisted to the end, even as he was proposing his theory of the infinitely structured organic body, that he was doing so not in order to reverse the tide of mechanism, but in order to save mechanism from the dead-end that philosophers such as Descartes had created for it by proposing such a weak analogy between animal bodies and artificial contraptions, and then adding the je-ne-sais-quoi of fermentation or the like in order to account for the obvious difference between these two categories of entity. It is Leibniz's adversaries, with their plastic natures and so on, who "enchant" nature by filling it with spirit-like entities doing the work that, they believe, nature would not know to do on its own. These people give up too easily, Leibniz thinks, while Descartes does not give up, but also does not get very far with his austere version of mechanism.

Leibniz, on this reviewer's understanding, would thus see reenchantment as a defeat, and is able to avoid that defeat by introducing infinity into his account of living nature. It is the remarkable achievement of Nachtomy's groundbreaking book to have shown us the deep theoretical interconnection of infinity and life in Leibniz's philosophy, so that it comes as at least a small disappointment to see, at the end, a somewhat exhausted cliché about the death of nature at the hands of the mechanical philosophers. But I could be wrong about this too, and a broad historiographical question of this sort deserves many different interpretations. Either way, moreover, the great contribution of this book remains the same with or without the concluding reflection on the larger historical significance of what Nachtomy has so masterfully expounded and analyzed.