Living Thought: The Origins and Actuality of Italian Philosophy

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Roberto Esposito, Living Thought: The Origins and Actuality of Italian Philosophy, Zakiya Hanafi (tr.), Stanford University Press, 2012, 296pp., $23.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804781565.

Reviewed by Davide Scarso, Universidade Nova de Lisboa


Roberto Esposito, one of the main interpreters of contemporary Italian philosophy, proposes reconstructing the history and essential features of Italian thought from the 16th century to the present. His ambiguous position and his double gaze, both as spectator and actor, could be seen as a neutral factor or even as a limitation. However, the strength of his book stems precisely from its lack of total correspondence with itself, from its being out of phase and constantly exceeding itself along tightly-knit contours that never coincide. As it moves back and forth between carefully documented historical reconstruction and original theoretical elaboration, the text undoubtedly retains what the author deems to be one of the most salient features of Italian thought: its being always "thought in action".

From the outset, Esposito intends to avoid the main potential objections to a book on the history of Italian thought and he does so by placing his work at the intersection of Deleuzian geophilosophy and Foucauldian genealogy. According to the geophilosophical outlook, philosophy does not begin by being vertically rooted in an assumed motherland but rather develops from a constant tension between the inside and the outside, which is what eliminates the possibility of any nationalistic essentialism. Intersecting with geophilosophy, a genealogical approach aims at underlining the non-historicist character of the author's reconstruction. An original, productive perspective ensues from this intersection and cuts across Esposito's very language, always extremely controlled and excellently rendered into English by Zakiya Hanafi. Merely chronological aspects are left in the background -- never using terms like 'predecessor' or 'heir', for example -- in favor of a 'topological' lexicon made of edges, strata, protrusions, empty spots and rotations.

The two approaches are not only concerned with simple, preliminary methodological questions (assuming that simple, preliminary methodological questions even exist). Turning Deleuze's judgment of Italian philosophy upside down, Esposito sees it as being intrinsically geophilosophical since it developed within a geographical space that only took the shape of a nation much later than most other European countries. Rather than an indication of backwardness, the absence of a unified national context now becomes one of the motives for the international resonance of Italian thought. At a time of profound crisis of the nation state, this thought seems in fact more prepared to deal with unprecedented political processes that traditional categories fail to understand. However, according to Esposito, the "Italian difference" does not end here. It is even more deeply anchored in an imperfect adherence to modernity's whole conceptual framework, of which the State is no more than a corollary. Rather than succumbing to the myth of "abrasion" of the past, which characterizes modern thought and is fatally destined to give rise to its "spectral return", Italian philosophy has maintained a constant relation with the origin. This relation is tense and antinomic and never results in an equally mythical return to a foundation. Instead, it sees the origin as a latent energy reserve, ready to be reactivated under certain conditions. On the other hand, if the genealogical approach consists in "tun[ing] in to the constitutive traits of the present by examining them in the light of its deep roots" (p. 23), Italian thought also proves to be intrinsically genealogical.

According to Esposito, the major traditions feeding contemporary thought -- Anglo-Saxon analytical philosophy, French deconstruction, German critical theory and hermeneutics -- albeit seemingly opposed to each other, all share the same transcendental horizon that assigns a dominant role to language. It is precisely through its tight connection with the sphere of language that philosophical experience appears today to wear itself out in the negation of its own ambitions. The possibility of breaking the current deadlock and developing an affirmative thought thus implies questioning the transcendental primacy of language.

Among the paths that could untangle thought from the current circuit of self-inhibition, as anyone who has a passing acquaintance with Roberto Esposito's work may already presume, the most promising is the one that congeals around the notion of biopolitics. This line of thought, as is well known, was inaugurated by Michel Foucault in the 1960s. However, following a prolonged dormancy, it was only fully developed and articulated in Italy -- in particular, but not exclusively, by Giorgio Agamben, Toni Negri and Esposito himself. Italian thought would come to promote a sort of "biopolitical turn" in which multiple, heterogeneous research paths take the connection between the "biological substratum of life" and the "shifting order of history" (p.10) as their central nucleus. Once a tense but inescapable relation is established between life and history, such a connection inevitably takes on a political nature. Therefore, Esposito believes it is no coincidence that the biopolitical paradigm has found Italy the most suitable terrain for its expansion. As he tries to demonstrate, while major strands of modern thought were developed around the theory of knowledge and subjectivity, Italian thought embraced from the very start the categories of life, history and politics -- completely external to any transcendental retreat -- as its main focus. Hence these dimensions, at once distinct and inseparable, become the main axes through which Esposito's genealogy of Italian philosophy is developed.

The book has five chapters, each divided into three sections. Each of the three middle chapters is about three thinkers. This ternary procedure is suspended and rendered more complex by the insertion between chapters of four brief but dense texts entitled "Passages" (I am afraid their relative autonomy is partly lost in the translation since they are more integrated within each chapter than they are in the original edition).

Not by chance, the first chapter is dedicated to humanism, the notion of threshold, and the origin of modernity. According to Esposito, the anti-humanist controversy initiated by Heidegger and widely resonating in contemporary thought has had a paradoxical outcome. Impelled to vindicate a radical distance between man and animal, in the name of the primacy of language and at the expense of any reference to biological life, the German philosopher reached a sort of hyperhumanism. This prevented him from grasping, behind the Promethean message to which tradition has accustomed us, what Esposito defines as "the vertigo of humanism" (p.32), i.e. the presence of motives that invalidate any possible metaphysical foundation for the human world. When Pico writes in the Oration that man has received "no fixed seat, no form of thy very own, no gift peculiarly thine" from God, he does not only refrain from proposing a substantial definition of man but also sanctions the passage from a conception based on the centrality of being to one that rests uniquely on becoming. The image in which man is somewhere halfway between beast and angel conceals, under the common moralizing reading, the idea that "human beings are nothing other than what they become, or better, what they intend to 'make' of themselves" (p.41) and suggests a possible alternative to the modern notion of subject. In Esposito's suggestive reading of humanism, its message is far from univocal and, together with a conception that makes man the measure of all things, also encompasses the idea of a being that needs all things to make itself human.

In light of what we have seen so far, the title of the second chapter, "The Power of the Origin", dedicated to Machiavelli, Bruno and Vico, takes on a double meaning. It concerns not only the origin of Italian thought, the theoretical influence those thinkers still have today, but also a peculiar relation with the origin, intended at once as zero-point of history, vital substratum and primordial conflict. This origin "is not located in the founding will of a group of subjects; but rather, in the depths of an animal life that breaks through the confines of human consciousness, connecting it with something preceding it and going beyond it" (p.71). Placed at the threshold of modernity, at different moments and for different reasons, the reflections of Machiavelli, Bruno and Vico constitute what Esposito considers to be an "early deconstruction" of modernity's main dispositifs.

In the modern political space -- based on a refusal of the "state of nature", seen as an ungovernable abyss of indeterminacy -- the sovereign order establishes itself as the neutralization of conflict. The political thinking of Machiavelli, by assuming instead that conflict is constitutive of order, is situated, according to Esposito, before the modern as well as beyond it. Furthermore, if there is no space that could be guaranteed in principle -- the author would say, immunized from discord -- just as there is no such thing as a nucleus of pre-political 'bare life', which would be precisely the object of modern negation. The very distinction between politics and a vital, pre-political horizon is missing: "in this original indistinguishability -- in a knowledge not on life (which is soon to arise) but of life, inseparable from the vital substratum of its object -- there may very well lie the still unexplored possibility of something like an affirmative biopolitics" (p.51).

Bruno, by making divinity coincide with the process of world self-generation and consequently refusing to attribute to it the character of subject, initiates the critique of the idea of personhood. Just as God does not precede the world but coincides with its becoming, human subjectivity does not precede its own constitution and is not a precondition for its becoming. This perspective reflects a radical reconfiguration of the relations between nature and history, between life and technics: "Unlike what the new modern philosophies were theorizing, the artifactual is not something additional or alternative to nature, created by humans to free themselves from their bodily constraints; rather it is their very effect" (p.68).

Vico is acknowledged as the one who, starting from the distinction between divine history and profane history, breaks the temporal circularity of traditional conceptions and introduces the dramatic within history. Nevertheless, he did not think of history as being simply linear, whether this is understood in a providential or secularized sense. In particular, and this is what Esposito takes most to heart, Vico places the origin of human history outside the temporal movement from which it began. The origin is in its essence "pre-historical"; at every attempt to get closer to it, it pushes itself further backwards and proves to be prior to any actual beginning. With this gap between origin and history, which makes the former impossible to grasp and therefore somehow always present, Vico avoids the tendency to reduce history to temporality. This tendency, according to Esposito, is "one of the most powerful immune devices of modernity" (p.73, strangely here the tran­slator does not use the expression "immunitary dispositif", closer to the original in Italian, which he uses in other passages).

Although Vico affirms the intrinsic unrepresentability of the origin, he does not relinquish the paradoxical attempt to represent it in its excess, beyond the confines of human history. For the author, this explains the reference to the excessive and uncontainable -- thus "improper" -- bodies of the Giants, which, as The New Science describes, wander aimlessly in the post-diluvial great forest: "It is here -- in this 'disbelonging' of each with respect to the all, in this lack of distinction that causes bodies to be confused with one another and humors to be mixed -- that life has its beginnings, expressing its expansive potency to the maximum" (p.78). In the last pages of the section dedicated to Vico (which, together with the following "Passage", seems to be at the core of the book), Esposito further elaborates on the link between that "corporeal magma", which he explicitly relates to the primordial communitas, and the human history to which it gives origin. That savage community is a source of energy but also a vortex that threatens to spin all forms into confusion. In order for life forms to arise from that swarm of formless life, just as societas arises from communitas, a differentiating authority must intervene. In The New Science this intervention takes the form of the thunderbolt that shakes the Giants and awakens them from their unreflective life. Therefore, even for Vico, as for Hobbes, the order of human history is founded upon the "biopolitical exchange between protection and salvation" (p.81). However, if on the one hand it is not possible to simply reascend backwards along this "immunitary" path so as to undo such an exchange, on the other hand this exchange is not concluded once and for all and cannot be indefinitely intensified. In the Viconian 'recourse' -- a catastrophic moment in historical development when everything is called into question -- Esposito perceives the negative charge present from the start in the process of immunization that, taken to its extreme, ends up being directed against life itself. Therefore, the core issue is to try to think the relation between originary communion and immunitary protection as an indissoluble conflict in which neither of the two poles could be sacrificed and which no dialectical movement could unify in the name of a superior synthesis: "The only remaining option to prevent us from plunging backward is to keep our eyes on the line of tangency that simultaneously separates and connects them, making one the irreducible content of the other" (p.83).

In this way, it becomes crucial to keep the reference to an origin alive and present, even if it remains constitutively elusive and ungraspable. The fact that Esposito himself, in an unusual foray into aesthetics, proposes a representation of the origin and its own unrepresentability bears testimony to the centrality of this aspect for the economy of his book but also, I would say, for his theoretical project as a whole. The absent image -- which becomes the image of absence -- chosen by the author is Leonardo da Vinci's Battle of Anghiari, a painting left unfinished, which already began deteriorating while it was being made and was subsequently walled up. It is not a pure absence but, so to speak, a determined one since a series of preparatory sketches and numerous copies that followed (some of which are reproduced in the text) allow us to somehow access its content. Following Esposito's interpretation, we can indirectly discern what Leonardo must have seen not only as the representation of a battle pitching Florentines against Milanese near Arezzo, but more broadly as "conflict as such" (p.99), a spasmodic entanglement of human and animal bodies, the empty spot in which "origin and end, creation and destruction, freedom and violence" (p.88) clash while they clutch each other.

While nineteenth-century Italian thought (represented by Francesco de Sanctis, Federico Cuoco and Giacomo Leopardi) questions itself about the unbridgeable distance that separates life from conceptual understanding, in the following period the solution is no longer sought in the attempt to bring life once again within the language of philosophy. In the early twentieth century, in an effort to radically historicize thought, Gentile and Gramsci try to turn philosophy into a "living thought" directly integrated with the sphere of life and action and, therefore, also with politics. Even Croce, who still rejects that prospect, ends up negatively adhering to it, precisely because of the sharpness of his rejection. A period of reflux follows the extraordinarily productive early part of the twentieth century. However, after Gramsci, Gentile and Croce, an entire way of interpreting philosophy reaches a point of exhaustion. According to Esposito, Gramsci -- and, to a lesser extent, Gentile -- reach the limits of the modern tradition, albeit without escaping that "theologico-political" paradigm, which is one of its main axes and corresponds, according to a deliberately summarized definition, to the "presupposed reconciliation of the different points of view into a single perspective that is apparently endowed with a universal validity" (p.217).

It is precisely by rejecting this principle -- and thus attempting to surpass the horizon of modernity -- that the 1960s see a period of renovated theoretical ambition open up. The author dedicates the last chapter of his book, "The Return of Italian Philosophy", to this period during which, according to him, Italian thought reconnects with its "originary inspiration". The judgment made by Esposito, who at this point doubles himself even more clearly in his role of "participant observer", is rather critical. Regarding the more directly political domain, proceeding along different and even profoundly divergent trajectories, Mario Tronti's theory of the "autonomy of the political", Toni Negri's notion of "constituent power", and the whole reflection on the 'impolitical' initiated in Italy by Massimo Cacciari, end up "bounc[ing] back against [themselves] without reaching an affirmative horizon" (p.235). Concerning the tension between history and origin, his judgment is no less critical in relation to the philosophical interpretation of "secularization", developed along opposing lines by Augusto Del Noce and Gianni Vattimo. According to Esposito, such an interpretation cannot lead to productive conclusions. Even Giorgio Agamben's original and structured theoretical project, which pushes the paradigm of secularization to its most extreme conclusions, remains, according to Esposito, de facto indeclinable in political terms.

All that is left then is the strand more tightly linked to the category of life, which is precisely the one Esposito follows. In the last pages of his work he sums up the main features of his own research. In doing so, he shows how it is intimately bound to the originary traits of Italian thought, while also trying to avoid the aporias of some of its most recent developments. In this sense, it is necessary to break the apparently unbreakable association between politics and subjectivity, an obstacle that impolitical thought -- to which Esposito adhered during the first phase of his philosophical development -- has managed to outline but not overcome. This is certainly not a matter of simply negating the category of subject, but rather of "twisting it to such a degree that it is emptied of its individual and general character, so as to push it toward the equally problematic conjunction of the singular and the common" (p.228). Such a prospect is explored in The Third Person (Polity Press, 2012) -- the book preceding the one under review -- and, according to Esposito, can be traced back to the thought of Giordano Bruno, as previously mentioned. However, it is equally crucial to simultaneously abandon any reference to secularization, a framework inevitably undermined by the theologico-political paradigm. The author considers that the attainment of this objective could be facilitated by displacing the political lexicon in the direction of a semantics focused on biological life. Here he clearly refers back to Bios: Biopolitics and Philosophy (University of Minnesota Press, 2008), but also to his most recent work: Two: The machine of political theology and the place of thought (Due. La macchina della teologia politica e il posto del pensiero. Still not translated into English). However, this entire path, as well as the very viability of what Esposito calls "affirmative biopolitics", proves to be dependent upon the possibility of thinking the reference to the originarity of biological life as an intrinsically undomesticable determinate void: necessary as much as impossible, unfathomable as much as unavoidable. The philosophical core of Living Thought lies precisely here.