Living Together: Inventing Moral Science

Living Together

David Schmidtz, Living Together: Inventing Moral Science, Oxford University Press, 2023, 263pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780197658505.

Reviewed by Michael Huemer, University of Colorado


Living Together is a series of 23 short essays on a variety of interrelated topics in moral and political philosophy. Topics include what the task of political philosophy has been and should be, the nature of justice and its function in human society, what sort of social rules and institutions promote prosperity, the nature and source of moral reasons, and the relationship between morality and self-interest, among others. Here, I will focus on what I found the most interesting and important ideas.

Schmidtz suggests that political philosophy is prior to moral philosophy. How so? Our moral reasons depend (largely, if not entirely) on social rules, but not just any social rules give us moral reasons; rather, only rules that are socially beneficial provide moral reasons (245). Determining which rules and institutions are socially beneficial is the task of what Schmidtz calls “moral science”, a field of study initiated by David Hume and Adam Smith but unfortunately neglected since then. (Aside: “Moral” and “science” both had somewhat different meanings in Hume’s day than in ours, so the phrase doesn’t exactly mean what it sounds like to modern ears.) Moral science, properly done, would draw on philosophy, economics, history, and perhaps other disciplines. As Schmidtz emphasizes, the conclusions of moral science rest on fallible inferences from empirical evidence—in particular, evidence about which institutions and rules have a track record of promoting human welfare.

In this picture, justice is a set of social rules with a particularly important function in enabling human societies to work and to prosper. Namely, the rules of justice manage potential conflicts and resolve actual conflicts among members of society.

To explain: Human beings gain enormous benefits by living together and especially by trading with other people. (Schmidtz suggests that our ancestors may have outcompeted the Neanderthals mainly due to our superior capacity for beneficial trade with each other (Ch. 22)). But social interaction brings with it a widespread potential for conflict due to the tensions among different people’s goals. Our goals may conflict due either to selfishness or to disagreements about what is good and true. My examples: Two people might each want to live (alone) on the same parcel of land, or two people of opposing religions might each want to promote their own religion as much as possible. All parties cannot get everything they want. Without some social conventions to resolve the conflict, there is a risk of the situation degenerating into violence. Without a solution to this problem, social cooperation would be impossible, and almost everyone would be drastically worse off than they are in any functioning human society.

Because it is impossible, in any realistic, large society, to get human beings to share the same goals, we need a set of rules and institutions that enables humans to cooperate peacefully despite deep disagreements. The most successful rules generally work by identifying which person in a given situation has the right of decision-making over which matters. These rules should not presuppose the correctness of particular goals, and they should seem to take everyone’s claims seriously at face value.. Schmidtz uses the metaphor of traffic management: When two or more cars come to an intersection, there is a potential conflict over who may proceed first. A traffic light tells them who has the right of way at the moment, without anyone needing to evaluate the destinations of the two drivers. This is important, since a system that required someone to evaluate those destinations would court interminable disagreement in some cases, and enormous wasted time in almost all cases.

Perhaps the most obvious application of this metaphor is to property rights. Return to the scenario in which two people each want to use the same land in ways that conflict with each other. We have a social institution of “property”, which tells the parties which of them (if either) may decide how the land is to be used. The rules don’t require evaluating the worthiness of the individual purposes. The rules might, for example, say that the person to discover the land first is the one with the decision-making power.

No human-made set of rules can anticipate every situation, so sometimes cases will arise about which the rules are either silent or ambiguous. For such cases, the rules of justice will specify a resolution procedure, generally involving an impartial judge. That judge should resolve the case with an eye toward the social function of the particular rules at issue. One case that Schmidtz cites is that of Hinman v. Pacific Air Transport, decided in 1936 (150–2). Hinman sued an airline company to enjoin them from flying over his land. As commercial air travel was a new phenomenon at the time, no pre-existing rules clearly settled who, if anyone, had rights over air space. But the court correctly reasoned that awarding the right to Hinman would cripple the fledgling airline industry, to no good purpose. Property rights exist to facilitate trade and cooperation, so their interpretation in an ambiguous case should not be such as to cripple commerce without good reason. So the court rightly sided with the airline, ruling that they need not obtain permission from every individual over whose land they passed.

Schmidtz promotes broadly libertarian ideas with a light touch (the word “libertarian” scarcely appears, and the most controversial implications of libertarian philosophy are left implicit at best). Thus, in discussing the problem of world hunger, Schmidtz observes that the social rules with the best track record of getting people fed have a lot more to do with protecting the rights of food producers than with protecting the rights of consumers. The reader is led to reflect on incentive structures. A socially enforceable right to be fed does not as such make people want to grow food. What makes people want to grow food is an enforceable right to do what you want to do with the food that you grow. It turns out, empirically, that the presence or absence of this sort of right has an enormous impact on the amount of food in existence, and thereby on the number of people who wind up going hungry.

(By the way, this point is broader than the familiar point that humans tend to be selfish. It applies as long as humans have different goals from one another, whether those goals be self-regarding or not. Even if I just want to feed the homeless people in Denver, I won’t grow food unless I can ensure that it will go to that altruistic purpose, rather than an unknown purpose devised by someone else.)

The point generalizes to other goods. The main way societies produce a large amount of value is through protecting the rights of producers. When there is scarcity, philosophers tend to focus their attention on figuring out how the limited goods should be distributed—what is each person’s fair share of the pie. But the better thing to focus on is how to reduce the scarcity, how to increase the size of the pie. It turns out that giving everyone what intuitively seems like a fair share of the pie tends to make the pie much smaller.

Schmidtz is on strong ground in criticizing other philosophers. Contemporary moral and political philosophy has spilled much ink over the requirements of justice and the problems of hunger and poverty. But most of that discussion is conducted in an unrealistic, armchair spirit. Philosophers rarely show awareness of empirical evidence and rarely consider the incentives generated by the social rules that they entertain. One can easily read an entire philosophical book about poverty and distributive justice without hearing mention of the fact that the world’s undernourished declined from 19% to 11% of the population from 1990 to 2014 (Schmidtz, 57)—nor any discussion of why that might have happened.

Consider the philosophical debate surrounding famine relief started by Peter Singer. Most of that debate concerns how much one must individually give to charity in order to be a morally decent person. Schmidtz doesn’t exactly disagree with Singer—he does not say that Singer is wrong about our duties to give to famine relief. But he wants to shift our attention to the question of why some societies have famines and others do not. As theorists who both want to understand society and care about how to improve it, that seems like a key question of interest. Perhaps if there was more understanding of how societies become famine-proof, the world could drastically reduce famine, without waiting for extreme degrees of altruism to arise in the human heart. I would add that some of the philosophical discussion of poverty not only fails to address the most important causes of poverty but actively promotes ideas that tend to exacerbate poverty (again, consider the point about rights of producers versus rights of consumers).

Another criticism of contemporary political philosophy concerns excessive idealization. Here, John Rawls appears as a primary offender. In devising rules of justice in his A Theory of Justice, Rawls proposed to set aside issues of compliance—that is, he proposed to assume that, once a set of rules of justice is selected, both citizens and the government will faithfully follow them. Schmidtz finds this an inappropriate idealization because, in his view, the issue of compliance is a central part of the problem that rules of justice exist to solve. I take it that part of the problem Schmidtz has in mind is that, once a government agency is directed to distribute wealth in the way that “maximizes the position of the worst off group”, the agency will use that power according to its own goals and beliefs. Powerful factions will vie for control of that agency. One cannot assume that what the agency comes up with will in fact maximize the position of the worst off group; all we know about human history rather suggests the opposite. This is not a minor detail; ignoring this problem does not produce an approximation of the correct result. Rather, taking this problem into account produces radically different recommendations.

As the reader may have guessed, I find Living Together extremely congenial. The book is filled with deep insights about how society works and about how social theorizing ought to work. As the author notes at one point, empirical research is what you do when you actually care about good outcomes (58). Most philosophers do not attend to empirical details about how the world works, which suggests that they may not care much about improving human society. David Schmidtz’s book is a call to care.

Are there any shortfalls of the book? Readers may find the theoretical discussion of ethics sketchy (though he has given more detail in other work (e.g., his Rational Choice and Moral Agency, 2015)). It is clear that, in Schmidtz’s view, we have moral reasons to follow social conventions that are highly beneficial. What is less clear is what one should do when confronted with social rules that are somewhat successful yet significantly sub-optimal. Should one still follow the currently accepted rules, or should one follow the optimal rules? What should one do in a situation where no social rules are established, yet one can see what the rules should be? Are there moral reasons other than those generated by useful social rules? Schmidtz’s claim that political philosophy must precede moral philosophy seems to require a negative answer to the last question, yet this does not seem to be correct. I have moral reasons for respecting the life of an isolated hermit. These moral reasons derive from the intrinsic value of that individual; I have no need to consult social conventions. If that’s right, then at least some moral philosophy can be done prior to political philosophy.

In a later chapter, Schmidtz discusses a way in which a person starting from purely instrumental reasons might acquire new intrinsic values, which could include moral values. Namely, a person might find it instrumentally valuable to adopt a new final end. For example, perhaps you wish to avoid loneliness, and you calculate that joining a campaign to save the whales would serve this end; however, you think that this will only work if you come to genuinely care, intrinsically, about the whales. In this case, you might adopt whale preservation as a new final end (204). Then, even if you later cease to be concerned about loneliness, you continue to strive to save the whales for their own sake.

I think this account works as a possible solution to a possible problem, yet it does not explain most cases. Schmidtz rightly notes that, as children, we begin with a very limited set of ends, mostly if not entirely self-centered, and somehow we later acquire more goals, and more sophisticated goals, including moral goals. However, I don’t think that this process needs to be explained by instrumental reasoning starting from the initial set of goals (nor does Schmidtz claim it must be), and I don’t think many cases look like that. As a baby, I had no goal of expanding the philosophical knowledge of my society. Today, I have that goal. But what happened was not that I calculated that adopting the goal of expanding philosophical knowledge would serve some other goal that I had as a child. I can assure you, I never thought that, and if I had, I’m not sure I could thereupon have willed myself to have the new final end. Rather, what seems to have happened is that (i) I came to understand what philosophy was (which the baby me could not understand), and (ii) upon thinking about it, I found it intrinsically fascinating. Most adult goals, I believe, are like that: Once we acquire the ability to understand them and we reflect upon them, we find them intrinsically attractive (see my Ethical Intuitionism, 2005).

Who should read Living Together? In brief, anyone who is interested in the nature of justice, social philosophy, or what makes societies work. Schmidtz has a colorful yet fundamentally accurate way of putting things—for example, the point that justice is about traffic management, which works by deciding whose turn it is, not whose destination is best. Mainstream political philosophers have particular reason to attend carefully to Schmidtz’s message. It may hold the key to making social theorizing something simultaneously far more interesting and far more helpful to society.


David Schmidtz, Rational Choice and Moral Agency, Sagent Labs, 2015.

Huemer, Michael, Ethical Intuitionism, New York: Palgrave Macmillan, 2005.