Living up to Death

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Paul Ricoeur, David Pellauer (Trans.), Living up to Death, University of Chicago Press, 2009, 108pp., $22.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780226713496.

Reviewed by Charles Reagan, Kansas State University


This is a strange book requiring a strange review. It is the publication of some of Paul Ricoeur's previously unpublished writing, which he himself did not intend to publish. The first part of the book comes from notes he made in 1995-96 on the topic of death. After they were written, they were left in a folder and he never returned to them again. In the second part of the book are some of the "fragments" he wrote during his last days, mostly brief reflections on topics which preoccupied him such as life and death, Christianity, his faith and his philosophy, the Bible, his friend Jacques Derrida and resurrection. There is a Preface by Olivier Abel, a long-time friend of Ricoeur's and a Postface by Catherine Goldenstein, also a very close friend for his last ten years.

I would recommend that the reader begin with Catherine Goldenstein's Postface because it explains the origin of the texts and why she thought they should be published. Ms. Goldenstein, a member of the Protestant temple in Chatenay-Malabry, befriended the Ricoeurs in the early 1990s, when Ricoeur's wife Simone was in declining health. Ms. Goldenstein came to their house most afternoons to have conversation and tea with the Ricoeurs and was especially important to Simone when Ricoeur was lecturing in other cities. She helped Ricoeur in his mourning for Simone after her death in 1998 and was especially helpful to him in his last year of decline.

The reflections Ricoeur wrote and entitled, "Up to Death: Mourning and Cheerfulness," were written during an especially difficult period when Simone was dying of a progressive illness that included several strokes and an increasing inability to participate in conversations. It was also the tenth anniversary of their son Olivier's suicide. At the time, Ricoeur was working on the manuscript which would be published as Memory, History, Forgetting.

According to the outline in Ricoeur's notes, the reflection on living and dying would be organized in three parts: "The figures of the imaginary," "Mourning and Cheerfulness," and "Am I still a Christian?" The actual reflections only follow this plan in a very vague and general way. He opens his reflection with a series of questions:

"Where to begin this late apprenticeship? By what is essential, right away? by the necessity and difficulty of mourning a wanting-to-exist after death? By joy -- no, instead, with cheerfulness joined to a hoped-for grace of existing until death?" (p. 7)

As the editors note, paragraphs are crossed out, to be placed elsewhere, and lines are corrected and marked up. This is clearly a first draft and not an example of Ricoeur's carefully worked and reworked prose. The difficulty of summarizing this part of the book is that there is no thesis, no fil conducteur, to lead logically from one topic to the next, or even from one reflection to the next. What it really shows is the struggle Ricoeur had in confronting death as he watched Simone die and contemplated his own death.

Some of the thoughts he puts down here are ones which have found expression in many of his other works, such as the fact that we do not experience the two most important events in our lives, our birth and our death. They are important to others, especially our closest family and friends, but for us they are an "already-happened" event (our birth) and a "not yet occurred" event (our death). He struggles with his Christianity, his belief in an afterlife, and whether the resurrection is a promised happening or a metaphor.

The second section is entitled "Fragments" and these were one-page notes or reflections that Ricoeur wrote near the end of his life. For him, the core of living was his reading and writing. He made it a point to write every day, usually in the morning. He continued this practice up to the point of his very last days when he was too weak. The first fragment begins, "I read on an art book cover: Watteau (1684-1721). These dates are those of the birth and death of a painter. The parenthesis thereby opened and closed fits tightly around a time of life cut out from historical time" (59). Ricoeur's question is: does this time limit the time of his work? No, the work exists as an independent thing long after the author -- or painter or composer -- is long gone. Another reflection is on his faith: "A chance transformed into a destiny by a continuous choice: my Christianity" (62). Ricoeur reflected on the relationship between his own personal history, his adherence to the Protestant branch of Christianity and his philosophy on many occasions. He accepts that he was born and raised as a Christian in the Reformed tradition, and admits that if he had been born at a different time and in a different country and in a different tradition, he would have different beliefs. However, he says, that person would not be he and he would not be that person. On this count, he is no better nor worse off than anyone else. We all are born into a tradition and are raised with a particular set of beliefs, but philosophy depends on rational arguments that are completely independent of religious faith and beliefs. Ricoeur has always taken great pains to distinguish his philosophical argumentation from any religious belief. What underlies this insistence is the typical slur he endured in France, "Oh, Ricoeur, he is a Christian philosopher, not a real philosopher."

The next fragment makes this even clearer:

"I am not a Christian philosopher, as rumour would have it, in a deliberately pejorative, even discriminatory sense. I am, on one side, a philosopher, nothing more, even a philosopher without an absolute, concerned about, devoted to, immersed in philosophical anthropology, whose general theme can be placed under the heading of a fundamental anthropology." (p. 69)

He goes on to say that he is a Christian and expresses and explores his faith in a philosophical language.

Ricoeur's last fragment is about his friend Jacques Derrida, who was dying of cancer a year or two before Ricoeur's own decline in health. They spoke frequently on the phone. Ricoeur begins this fragment, "If 'learning finally how to live' is to learn to die, to take into account accepting absolute mortality without salvation, resurrection, or redemption, I share all the negative here" (p. 85). He ends his homage to Derrida by saying, "I am quite ordinary and no doubt my works will endure less than will those of Derrida who is really quite extraordinary" (p. 87).

The editors include the reproduction of one of the pages of the fragments so the reader can see how Ricoeur was struggling to organize his ideas. It also shows the prodigious work they did in making these notes and fragments accessible.

If we return to the beginning, there is an interesting Preface by Olivier Abel who recounts that near the end of 1995 -- the period during which Ricoeur's notes on living up to death were written -- Ricoeur asked Olivier Abel to "undertake a correspondence with him about death and life, including all these questions." He discussed them with Ricoeur again in 1999 during a trip they took together to Turkey. Abel talks about Ricoeur's radical doubt, which was a kind of Kierkegaardian testimony to his faith. Abel ends his brief Preface with these words:

"The question then is no longer one of an infinite grieving for someone who, as all too often in human history, died for no reason, but rather one of infinite recognition as regards someone who was not born for nothing -- and this perhaps should be said of everyone." (p. xxii)

So, what are we to say about this slender volume? My first reaction when I read the French version was that they should not have published these notes and drafts and fragments. In 1989, Ricoeur permitted my colleague, David Stewart, and me to photocopy his drafts and unpublished manuscripts for the use of scholars. This work is in the Ricoeur Archive at Ohio University. The condition of Ricoeur's permission was that they not be published. In this case, the texts are disjointed, unfinished, and disorganized, the very opposite of Ricoeur's polished published works. They do not admit of a summary, or even of a coherent account following a chronological or topological order. Yet they do give a fascinating glimpse of Ricoeur's creative moment, at the "birth" of his philosophical thoughts. And they are reflections on death, that of his dear wife Simone, and later on his own impending death.

What changed my mind is knowing the editors, Catherine Goldenstein and Olivier Abel. They were the closest of his friends in his later years. I have said elsewhere and I repeat it here that without the care and compassion of Catherine Goldenstein, Ricoeur would have died many years sooner. Ricoeur befriended Olivier Abel at an early age since Olivier is the son of a former Pastor of the Reformed Church of Chatenay-Malabry. Ricoeur knew him from his youth and Olivier grew up knowing all of the Ricoeur family. It is because of Olivier Abel's efforts that the Ricoeur papers and library are now at the Faculty of Protestant Theology in Paris and will be housed in a new addition to the library there. The editors decided to publish these papers because of their conversations with Ricoeur about works living on after the death of their authors. I have the highest regard for their judgment about which papers should be published and which should remain drafts in the archive for the use of scholars.

This book is an excellent translation by David Pellauer and will be interesting and even fascinating to scholars who are already familiar with Ricoeur's work.