Living Well Now and in the Future: Why Sustainability Matters

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Randall Curren and Ellen Metzger, Living Well Now and in the Future: Why Sustainability Matters, MIT Press, 2017, 312pp., $34.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262036009.

Reviewed by Mylan Engel Jr., Northern Illinois University


The overarching theme of Curren's and Metzger's book is that sustainability -- the art of living well while preserving the opportunity to live well in the future -- is ultimately a problem of social coordination that can only be achieved through terms of cooperation that are fair, just, and mutually agreed upon and through the creation of institutions that are conducive to people living well both now and in the future. (p. xv) The book's central argument can be reconstructed as follows:

  1. Sustainability is ultimately a matter of diachronic justice whose normative core is preserving opportunities to live well well into the future.
  2. Humans collective demands—currently at 150% of the Earth’s renewable biocapacity—are not sustainable.
  3. Uncoordinated efforts of individuals are not sufficient to achieve sustainability.


  1. Coordinated public and collective efforts are essential.
  2. The public and collective coordination needed requires fair terms of cooperation.
  3. Our current politically biased, industry-beholden epistemic institutions, educational institutions, and workplaces are not conducive to achieving the personal virtues and understanding needed to reach the fair terms of cooperation required for sustainability.


  1. Sustainability requires (i) replacing our current epistemic institutions with transparent, veritistic epistemic institutions (academies of sciences and media) devoted to the dissemination of public knowledge, (ii) educating children in sustainability; and (iii) reforming our workplaces in ways that will allow people to live well while consuming considerably less.

The book consists of an introduction, six substantive chapters, a brief conclusion, fifty-one pages of endnotes, and an extensive bibliography.

Chapter 1 clearly demonstrates that humanity collectively is not living sustainably and highlights the urgency with which we collectivity need to start living sustainably. Consider a few of the key facts they highlight:

  • There has been a 90% decline in ocean fish populations since the advent of deep-sea fishing in the 1950s. (p. 14)
  • For over four decades, humanity’s demand has exceeded Earth’s biocapacity. (p. 17)
  • Between 1970 and 2010, the World Wildlife Fund’s Living Planet Report has shown a 52% decline in global populations of vertebrate species. (p. 17)
  • By 2030, nearly 50% of the global population will be living in areas of high water stress. (p. 17)
  • As many as 300,000 species have become extinct since 1950. (p. 22)

Curren and Metzger go on to note that the most serious problem facing humanity is climate disruption.

  • Atmospheric CO­2 concentrations have increased from preindustrial levels of 275 ppm to above 400 ppm. (p. 20)
  • Global CO2 emissions increased 49% between 1990 and 2010. (p. 20)
  • Observed changes have outpaced the worst-case projections of early climate models. (p. 20)
  • A stabilization target of 350 ppm (50 ppm below 2016 levels) would be more compatible with avoiding catastrophe than the 450-ppm target long thought safe. (p. 20)
  • Stabilization at 450 ppm would require:
  • a two-thirds reduction in global carbon emission by 2050,
  • a 90% reduction of U.S. carbon emissions by 2050, and
  • global carbon neutrality by 2100. (p. 20)
  • 4°C increase in average temperature may occur as early as the 2060s. (p. 22)
  • There is no certainty that human adaptation to a 4°C warmer world is possible. (p. 22)

On the basis of these and other data, Curren and Metzger rightly conclude that "declining ecological capacity and climate disruption will cause increasingly severe economic and noneconomic losses, more or less in perpetuity, unless the material throughput of human activities is substantially reduced" (p. 27)

The chapter also identifies three important kinds of sustainability/unsustainability: ecological sustainability, throughput sustainability, and sociopolitical sustainability. They characterize the former two as follows:

Ecological sustainability (unsustainability): The totality of practices of some human collectivity is ecologically sustainable (unsustainable) if and only if it is compatible (is not compatible) with the long-term stability of the natural systems on with the practices rely.

Throughput sustainability (unsustainability): The totality of practices of some human collectivity is environmentally sustainable (unsustainable) if and only if the material throughput on which it relies is compatible (is not compatible) with the projected provisioning capacity of natural systems.

They don't provide a formal characterization of sociopolitical sustainability (unsustainability), but the basic idea is that social and political institutions can be durable (i.e., sustainable) or they can be destined to collapse (unsustainable). Since stable institutions are essential to living well now and in the future, Curren and Metzger have identified an important but typically neglected third kind of sustainability.

In Chapter 2, Curren and Metzger reveal their deep pessimism about the effectiveness of uncoordinated individual efforts to bring about sustainability. They devote the bulk of the chapter to surveying the various obstacles to achieving sustainability through individual choices and actions. Among the obstacles identified (pp. 30-44) are these:

  • Deficiencies of public education efforts
  • Lack of enforcement of truth in advertising
  • Economic externalities and the fact that products’ full costs in natural capital are not reflected in their prices
  • Consumerism and social expectations: social status reflected though consumption
  • Cultural attachment to unsustainable practices
  • Advertising that induces people to purchase goods and services they do not need
  • The supposed “reproductive right” for couples to decide the number and timing of their children.
  • Deficiencies in systems of public knowledge
  • The withering of general education in institutions of higher learning
  • “Balanced” journalism that undercuts scientific consensus
  • Misleading corporate public relations campaigns
  • Psychological obstacles to reductions of household consumption (e.g., discounting evidence, optimism bias, religious ideologies, status quo bias, norms of consumption, etc.)

Given these obstacles to individual effectiveness, they conclude that "problems of sustainability are largely problems of social coordination that can only be solved through compliance with fair principles of cooperation" (p. 50). While Curren and Metzger are adamant that the uncoordinated actions of individuals will not suffice to bring about sustainability, they do think these actions are important if only to demonstrate the collective will needed to prompt government leaders to adopt the principles of cooperation needed to bring about sustainability globally.

Chapter 3 is devoted to two main tasks: (1) grounding an ethic of sustainability in two core elements of common morality, namely, the duty to respect others as rationally self-determining persons and the duty not to harm others; and (2) developing and defending a diachronic account of justice dubbed eudaimonic constructivism. The ethic of sustainability provided consists of five platitudes that anyone committed to sustainability would already accept. For example:

  1. Take care to ensure that the totality of human practices is ecologically sustainable. (p. 58)
  2. Take care to ensure that the throughput requirements of human practices are compatible with the projected provisioning capacity of natural systems. (p. 59)

There is nothing particularly deep or revelatory here.

The second half of Chapter 3 is more interesting. There, Curren and Metzger develop and defend their diachronic theory of justice, an interesting fusion of the Aristotelian idea that living well (Eudaimonia) is largely a product of fulfilling human potential in positive ways and the Rawlsian idea that fair principles of justice are those that would be adopted by self-interested, rational contractors situated behind a veil of ignorance. They assume, with Aristotle, that we all want to live well. Since we all want to live well, Curren and Metzger argue that rational contractors behind the veil of ignorance (being ignorant of when they are born) would agree to the Eudaimonic Principle:

The institutions of a society exist to enable all of its members to live well and should provide opportunities sufficient to enable all to do so and thereby provide each other such opportunities. (p. 80)

Drawing on empirical research in eudaimonic psychology and basic psychological needs theory, they argue that human flourishing requires satisfying three innate psychological needs: the need for competence, the need for self-determination, and the need for meaningful mutually affirming relationships. They conclude that a just constitutional system would contain epistemic institutions, educational institutions, and places of work that promote the fulfillment of these psychological needs.

Chapter 4 begins by arguing that in order to achieve the kinds of institutions a just constitutional system requires, we must: (i) replace our current epistemic institutions with transparent, veritistic epistemic institutions (mass media, academies of sciences, think tanks, etc.) devoted to the dissemination of truths important to the public interests, (ii) reform our educational institutions so that they not only equip children with the life skills needed to flourish, but also educate them in sustainability; and (iii) reform our workplaces in ways that will allow people to live well while consuming considerably less. The bulk of the chapter, however, is devoted to criticizing oligarchic multinational corporations, the U.S. media, and the U.S. educational system. With respect to the latter, Curren and Metzger argue that the current U.S. educational system and its attendant market credentialism increase economic stratification and reduce equal opportunity. They conclude by suggesting this market credentialism and its resultant stratification could be overcome by switching to the German model of education where most students pursue vocational education through apprenticeships and employment-based training.

Chapter 5 begins by exploring whether problems of sustainability are wicked problems. Curren and Metzger characterize "wicked" problems as "matters of public concern, typically involving interaction of complex social, economic, and environmental systems that are hard to predict and hard to control" (p. 125). They conclude that rather than being wicked, problems of sustainability are systemic action problems, a subset of collective action problems that require regional and global coordination and cooperation, collaborative governance, and limitations in top-down management. The chapter concludes with three interesting case studies: (i) the 2010 Gulf of Mexico oil spill, (ii) drought and water management in Australia's Murray-Daring Basin (a success story), and (iii) food and farming in the Mekong region of Southeast Asia.

Chapter 6 begins by reviewing the previous chapters and concluding on that basis that "an education in sustainability is a requirement of justice". The rest of the chapter is an attempt to develop a curriculum for educating students in sustainability [EiS]. Their proposed curriculum is rather complex and includes:

  • Initiation into scientific thinking about complex systems
  • Geology, ocean and climate science, ecology, and history of life
  • Geography, sociological systems, and patterns of societal survival and collapse
  • Economic and political world history, with attention to resources and production, energy transitions, environmental impact and governance, etc.
  • Local and global citizenship and cooperation
  • Technology and creative design
  • Critical and creative thinking
  • Media literacy
  • Psychology and health
  • Sustainability ethics. (p. 154)

Later in the chapter (pp. 172-5), Curren and Metzger advance the following additional curricular and instructional suggestions (each of which is further elaborated upon):

  • Respect children’s right to know, think for themselves, and use their own good judgment in living responsibly and well.
  • Teach environmental studies more systematically.
  • Integrate environmental studies with honest history and prehistory.
  • Integrate economics with these environmental studies.
  • Encourage resourcefulness, inventiveness, and adaptability.
  • Encourage the enjoyment of low-impact activities as a basis for living well and sustainably.
  • Decommercialize schools.
  • Teach critical thinking and enable children to distinguish the truth from propaganda.
  • Encourage critical self-reflection and creative living through literature and the arts.
  • Use collaborate, civic, and project-based learning.
  • Prepare children for global cooperation.
  • Prepare everyone for a world with lower fertility rates and the prospect of fewer human beings.
  • Prepare everyone for a world with lower fertility rates and the prospect of fewer human beings.

They close the chapter by addressing the charge that teaching the ethical components of EiS is tantamount to indoctrination. They respond first by noting that the principles of sustainability ethics are "applications of familiar and indisputable principles of common morality [the duty to respect persons and the duty not to harm others]" and then by arguing that since "all common law jurisdictions enforce this [common morality] through legal penalties, and it cannot possibly be legitimate to do so and yet fail to teach it" (p. 176).

My overall impression of the book is mixed. The book is clearly important and timely. At the same time, there are aspects of the book that are frustrating and disappointing. Starting with the positive, Curren and Metzger do an excellent job clarifying the normative core of sustainability, identifying three important kinds of sustainability, highlighting the urgency of shifting toward living sustainably, and developing a sophisticated account of diachronic justice. These features alone make the book worth reading.

That said, those looking for clearly developed pathways to sustainability will be disappointed.[1] There are very few positive proposals as to the specific kinds of policies that should be adopted to achieve sustainability, and the few they do mention are not developed in any detail. I would have liked to have seen much more development of these three proposals (especially the latter two):

Invoking a carbon tax aimed at capturing the negative externalities pertaining to climate in such a way as to make businesses and individuals who voluntarily sell and buy fossil fuels bear those costs of the products themselves.

Implementing a biocapacity tax assessed to limit biocapacity loss.

Establishing a "Planetary Boundaries Club" of countries on adherence to agreed-upon emissions standards that penalizes nonmember countries with uniform percentage tariffs on the imports of nonparticipants in the club.

One thing I found frustrating about the book is that it reads like two distinct books -- a book on sustainability and a book on the philosophy of education. I agree that the U.S. educational system would be vastly improved if the principles of education and the curriculum recommended by Curren and Metzger were implemented, but after the incredibly compelling case they made for the urgency with which humans collectively need to start living sustainably, I would like to have seen far more concrete, quickly implementable steps that humans could collectively take to start living sustainably (or at least more closely to sustainably).

I was also frustrated by their main policy proposal (the only proposal they develop in detail). They argue that the only way that we are going to get people from different countries to come together and accept government-mandated meaningful changes to their lifestyles so as to achieve sustainability collectively is for these countries to implement their proposed educational changes and EiS curriculum. They also argue that in order for CO2 levels not to exceed 450 ppm, the U.S. needs to cut carbon emissions by 90% by 2050. The problem is that there is little chance that we will see anything like their proposed radical overhaul of the educational curriculum implemented in U.S. schools by 2050. Just think about the large swaths of the country that still insist on teaching creationism in biology classes as a viable alternative to evolutionary theory,[2] not to mention the states with vested interests in the coal, oil, and natural gas industries. There is little chance that their proposed curricular changes will be implemented in any of these states. It is even less likely that these curricular changes will be implemented worldwide, which they would need to be if they are indeed indispensable to reaching the global agreements necessary to bring about sustainability. What we need are sustainability solutions for the world in which we actually live -- a world where most people aren't adequately educated in sustainability, because that is the world we will inhabit for the foreseeable future. We need concrete policies that can be implemented now. Time is not on our side.

Let me end on a positive note. In the Preface, Curren and Metzger express their hope that the book will prove "useful to those who wish to advance the conversation [about sustainability] further" (p. x). Their book does that in spades. I hope this review will help keep that conversation going.

[1] To be fair, Curren and Metzger expressly state that their goal is not to identify "a specific set of policy recommendations, but to provide a broad conceptualization of the normative principles that should inform such recommendations" (p. xxiii). But their disclaimer doesn't make it any less disappointing that a book focused on living well now and into the future fails to advance policy recommendations that will help us do just that.

[2] Currently, fourteen U.S. states fund public schools that teach creationism as an alternative to evolutionary theory and natural selection.