Living with Darwin: Evolution, Design, and the Future of Faith

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Philip Kitcher, Living with Darwin: Evolution, Design, and the Future of Faith, Oxford University Press, 2007, 192pp., $20.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195314441.

Reviewed by James Krueger, University of Redlands


In his latest book, Living with Darwin: Evolution, Design, and the Future of Faith, Philip Kitcher again takes up the task of defending evolutionary theory from creationist challenges.[1]  In this short, accessible work, he not only hopes to offer such a defense, he also aims to situate religiously motivated objections to evolution within the context of the history of encounters between defenders of evolution and religious believers.  The hope is to gain some sense of what the sources of the ongoing controversy are so that we might understand why the debate appears interminable.  Overall, the book's historical bent makes it a useful introduction to the topic, and it could help to move conversations about creationism in a more constructive direction, though perhaps not in the way Kitcher intends.

In the opening two thirds of Living with Darwin, Kitcher surveys three different forms of creationism (Genesis creationism, novelty creationism and anti-selectionism), and defends evolutionary theory against the kinds of arguments offered by proponents of each.  Advocates of Genesis creationism take the biblical creation story to be a literally true historical account of the origins of the universe.  Novelty creationism steps away from biblical literalism, and instead focuses attention on major transitions in the tree of life, such as the shift from unicellular to multicellular organism, or the evolution of complex structures such as the eye.  The basic view is that such changes can only be explained by reference to some form of intelligence that created these novel structures, bringing about fundamental separations in the tree of life that evolutionary theory cannot explain.  Finally, anti-selectionism raises questions only about the adequacy of natural selection as an explanation for the structure of the tree of life; it does not question the existence of a single, connected tree, nor does it rely on the biblical narrative for guidance.  Instead, it only supposes that some guiding intelligence must have played a role in evolution, that the blind mechanism of natural selection cannot do the job.  In discussing each form of creationism, care is taken to show how current arguments compare to earlier historical debates about the religious implications of Darwin's ideas.

These initial chapters provide a valuable overview of many of the major facets of the debate concerning evolution, and Kitcher rightly points to many of the shortcomings of creationist arguments.  Anyone who has followed these debates is unlikely to find anything new here, but that is precisely the point he wants to make.  By reexamining aspects of even the most radical young-earth creationist views, Kitcher hopes to accomplish two things:  first, to show how some creationist arguments currently offered have long histories, and were effectively refuted during the earliest days of discussions of Darwin's ideas; and second, to use this history to show how creationist ideas have been in steady retreat.  Ultimately, he contends, contemporary advocates of intelligent design are faced with either endorsing purely negative anti-selectionism, which only draws on concerns within the ongoing scientific conversation about evolution and does not offer any alternative positive account (making it unsuitable for supporting a biblical view of human origins), or making the kinds of robust claims which have been refuted in both historical and more recent incarnations.  Thus creationists are shown to have been fighting a defensive battle, unable to offer a credible scientific alternative to evolution, and as such having little new to offer even as their arguments take on greater apparent sophistication.

Again, anyone familiar with the ongoing debates is unlikely to find anything particularly new in this presentation.  What is most interesting about Kitcher's book, then, is the concession that such arguments, no matter how frequently or persuasively made, will prove inadequate to ending the debate.   Ultimately, he concludes that the main threat of intelligent design is not intellectual, for defenders of evolution have already won that battle, but rather political.  It is not the scientific arguments that are most crucial; what matters more is the "wink" that he suggests contemporary defenders of intelligent design give to certain religious believers, giving them hope that there is an alternative to evolution compatible with their faith.  It is the political commitment of these supporters that is the real threat; the argument itself has long ago been settled.  The challenge, then, is to understand the source of this political commitment.  Why is it that so many want so badly for there to be an alternative to the Darwinian story?  It this question that Kitcher takes up in his final chapter, hoping that by understanding the source of this political activity we can finally find a way to put the cultural debate over evolution to rest.

Kitcher argues that the reason so many find evolutionary theory so disturbing is that it truly is incompatible with a certain kind of religion, what he calls providentialist religion, which involves "belief that the universe has been created by a Being who has a great design, a Being who cares for his creatures, who observes the fall of every sparrow and who is especially concerned with humanity" (122-123).  Evolution presents two problems for such religious views.  First, it makes suffering an essential part of the world.  It forces us to suppose that "a providential Creator … has constructed a shaggy-dog story, a history of life that consists of a three-billion-year curtain raiser to the main event, in which millions of sentient beings suffer, often acutely, and that the suffering is not a by-product but constitutive of the script the Creator has chosen to write" (124).  Second, all providentialist religions accept certain truths about the supernatural (for example, asserting the existence of some god).  Such claims, the argument goes, are simply not subject to rational evaluation and as such there can be no reason to prefer one supernaturalist story to another.  Thus the basis for accepting any particular religion disappears.  Kitcher contends that these kinds of arguments are at the heart of the enlightenment critique of religion, a broader set of arguments that the debate over evolution must be situated within, and that this critique is devastating for providentialist religions.

Nonetheless, Kitcher tries to look beyond a simple rejection of religion to see what it is that religion provides for believers.  He writes, "the benefits religion promises to the faithful are obvious, and obviously important, perhaps most plainly when people experience deep distress" (155).  Drawing on the writings of Elaine Pagels, he argues that it is this desire for comfort, particularly in the face of death, that is so important to the faithful.  The fear of losing this, of being cast free in an uncaring universe, is what leads to such strong commitment to providentialist beliefs and thus what drives the debate over evolution.  This is the source of commitment to the anti-evolution cause.

Thus the way forward, Kitcher suggests, is to meet this need without having to accept dubious providentialist claims.  He argues a "spiritualist" religion, a religion that gives up "the literal truth of the stories contested by the enlightenment case" (152), can do this.  So, for example, a spiritualist Christianity would keep "the teachings, the precepts, the parables, and the eventual journey to Jerusalem and the culminating moment of the Crucifixion" (152), but these stories would be transformed from stories about the literal Son of God to "a symbolic presentation of the importance of compassion and love without limits" (152).  Such spiritualist Christianity, he claims, could still provide the basis for a community of believers that provides genuine comfort without coming into conflict with modern science or enlightenment rationality.

The problems with such a position, however, are not hard to recognize.  From the point of view of the religious believer, such a spiritualist religion looks much too thin to count as genuine religious belief.  Could one really be called a Christian if he or she didn't believe that God exists, that Jesus is the Son of God, and so on?  Can being a Christian simply mean reading the Bible to find parables one finds useful in illustrating certain general ethical precepts?  On the other hand, the secularist is going to immediately ask why it should be that one should focus on one set of stories over another.  The same enlightenment critique that was pressed against the providentialist can be pressed again.  Some reason for accepting one set of stories must be provided.  But, if such a justification can be offered (offered, as it must, in a way that relies on no supernaturalist claims), then why isn't the position really just a secular humanism dressed up in some fancy stories?  Why go through the charade of faith at all?

Kitcher recognizes both these problems but stops short of seeing them as fatal for the prospects of a spiritualist religion.  Instead, he states that while he cannot see how a spiritualist religion can escape such challenges, it is "not clear how to circumscribe all responses" to the worries presented, and so no final verdict can be reached (154).  There is at least the possibility that a spiritualist religion can be defended.

Ultimately, though, it is abundantly clear that Kitcher believes the secular humanist alternative will prove adequate for providing the kind of comfort, community and meaning that he believes we all crave.  So, Kitcher contends, it makes sense that debates over evolution are so prominent in the United States and not other modern western democracies.  For, he writes, "Unlike their contemporaries in Western Europe, Americans are often unprotected against foreseeable misfortunes" and "there is no counterpart to the neighborhood pub or the piazza," leaving only churches to "provide the sense of community that addresses the insufficiencies in their lives" (163).  If Americans did a better job constructing community spaces and providing social services, the contention seems to be, the need for religion would disappear, and with it the debate over evolution.

Even setting aside doubts about this sweeping claim, there are several reasons to find this closing chapter unsatisfying and ultimately unpersuasive.  For one, there really isn't much new in the critique of religion that he offers.  Christian thinkers have wrestled with the problem of evil in many incarnations for as long as Christianity has existed, so it is a bit hard to see why this Darwinian incarnation suddenly creates an insurmountable obstacle to faith.  Is the suffering of animals in the course of evolution that much more difficult to understand than the intense suffering of children born with horrific genetic diseases?  And further, doesn't the very possibility of arguments for and against divine justice in the face of the world we experience suggest the possibility of rational discourse about the nature of the supernatural?  Kitcher quickly moves from historical biblical scholarship to a conclusion that the gospels are not divinely inspired, hinting that it is ignorance of such work that allows Christians their faith, but this simply ignores many faithful scholars who are actively engaged in such scholarship and find it no impediment to faith.  Are so many devout scholars simply confused, unable to see how their own work undermines their faith?

Nonetheless, I think Kitcher is right to turn to such broadly theological questions in his attempts to find what is at the heart of the debate over evolution.  It does seem apparent that no amount of scientific response will silence creationist challenges, suggesting that the mistake that drives such arguments must be found elsewhere than in the scientific detail.  Here, however, is where Kitcher's approach ultimately becomes counterproductive, for like other contemporary critics of religion, he is unable to take seriously that (providentialist) religious faith could be compatible with rational discourse, that religious believers could have reasons for what they believe.  All it could possibly be is a way of satisfying some deep psychological need.  If the enlightenment critique of religion is correct, then there can be no rational dialogue about the supernatural, all there can be is unthinking commitment to certain truths.  If that is all that is available, then religious claims must be excluded from public debate, they cannot serve as the basis for defending commitments within the context of modern democratic societies (if such debates are supposed to proceed according to reason).  In this sense, modern creationists can be understood not as failing to learn the lesson of the enlightenment critique, but of learning it all too well.  Accepting the absolute division of rationality and faith, the route to assuring space for religious belief becomes making all beliefs essentially based on simple commitment, not rational defense.  Hence, modern intelligent design comes to take on an essentially negative form, highlighting the limits of scientific rationality.  There is no longer the need to defend a positive case, for no case can be made on rational grounds.  All we have is commitment.  All we have is political manipulation and indoctrination.  There is no rational basis for any belief, no reasoned dialogue, so anything goes (this is the source of the winks in the direction of Genesis creationism).  Thus, the public focuses on evolution being "just a theory," and attention turns to public schools, political action, calls for "equal time" and the like.  Kitcher is right: the arguments don't really matter, because arguments can't matter; all that remains is political activity.  Religious believers come, perhaps unwittingly, to accept a kind of postmodern critique of pretensions to enlightenment rationality once they are denied the possibility of rational participation in the public sphere by defenders of such pictures of rationality.  Once this happens, the prospect for a reasoned resolution to the debate disappears.  All there can be is political activity.

If this story is right, the way forward is to take very seriously the kinds of theological and philosophical arguments Kitcher takes up in his last chapter, and respond to them with careful, rational arguments defending religious faith, not to abandon rational dialogue about substantive (providentialist) religious claims.  This means religious persons must move beyond unthinking acceptance and build on rich traditions of theological and philosophical reflection, and critics of religion must recognize the role of reason in such reflections and engage them on that basis.  By rebuilding the long tradition of rational engagement with religion, we can give religious believers a voice that eliminates the driving force behind such ultimately skeptical arguments (exclusion from rational public discourse).  In this respect, Kitcher's book can prove useful, for he does identify the kinds of theological arguments that religious believers must respond to, even though he puts those arguments to use in attempting to justify conclusions that are ultimately too strong.

Despite these reservations, Kitcher's book remains a useful short introduction to arguments concerning evolution and creationsim, and may prove important in encouraging greater reflection on the philosophical and theological questions that can rebuild the kind of rational dialogue about religion that is ultimately necessary to move the debate in a positive new direction.

[1] Kitcher's first on the topic was Abusing Science: The Case Against Creationism, MIT Press, 1982.