Living with Uncertainty: The Moral Significance of Ignorance

Placeholder book cover

Michael Zimmerman, Living with Uncertainty: The Moral Significance of Ignorance, Cambridge UP, 2008, 218pp., $81.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521894913.

Reviewed by Kevin Timpe, Northwest Nazarene University



A scholar is asked to review another scholar’s book: what ought he do? The answer to this question will depend on many factors, such as his other previous obligations, his competence, etc. But suppose that the first scholar, hereafter Reviewer, agrees to review the book of the other scholar, hereafter Author, and violates no norm in making that agreement. What ought Reviewer do? Presumably, Reviewer ought to review Author’s book. If Reviewer reviews the book in question, there is a further question in the vicinity: what kind of review ought Reviewer to write? The answer to this question will depend on one’s view regarding the nature of our obligations. Two leading accounts are as follows:

the Objective View: an agent ought to perform an act iff it is the best option that he has — in this case, Reviewer ought to write what would actually be the best review of Author’s book he can;

the Subjective View: an agent ought to perform an act iff he believes that it is the best option that he has — in this case, Reviewer ought to write what he thinks would be the best review of Author’s book he can.

In Living with Uncertainty, Michael Zimmerman argues against both the Objective View and the Subjective View. The general problem with the Objective View is ignorance and the corresponding uncertainty that accompanies it. How, in the light of the “background of massive ignorance” is Reviewer supposed to know what the best review of Author’s book he can write would be (ix)? If it isn’t possible for him to know what the best option is, how can he be obligated to actualize that option? The general problem with the Subjective View is that it ties moral obligation too closely to an agent’s beliefs. What if, for example, Reviewer has an unjustified professional bias against Author’s work in general, and thus (falsely) believes that he ought to write an inaccurate and inflammatory review of Author’s book? According to a version of the Subjective View, Reviewer is obligated to write such a review.

In lieu of both the Objective and the Subjective view, Zimmerman advocates and defends what he refers to as the Prospective View. Though the view gets more complex as the book progresses, a first approximation of the Prospective View is that

our overall moral obligation is always to choose that option that is prospectively best under the circumstances… . The prospectively best option is that which, from the moral point of view, it is most reasonable for the agent to choose (xi).

Unpacking, explaining, and applying the Prospective View shapes the general contours of Zimmerman’s book.

Living with Uncertainty is divided into four substantial chapters. In the first, “Ignorance and Obligation”, Zimmerman argues for the superiority of the Prospective View over both the Objective and Subjective Views. This chapter, as well as the book as a whole, makes significant use of a number of permutations of a case given by Frank Jackson:1

Jill, a physician, has a patient, John, who is suffering from a minor but not trivial skin complaint. In order to treat him, she has three drugs from which to chose: A, B, and C. Drug A would in fact be best for John. However, Jill believes that B would be best for him, whereas the available evidence indicates that C would be best for him (6).

Whereas the Objective View entails that Jill ought to give John drug A, and the Subjective View entails that she ought to give him drug B, the Prospective View holds that she ought to give him drug C since that is the option that, given her available evidence, is has the best prospect of achieving the desirable outcome of John’s health. Though one doesn’t get Zimmerman’s definitive formulation of the Prospective View until Chapter Three (135), the approximation he develops in Chapter One claims that “an agent ought to perform an act if and only if it is the prospectively best option that he has” (56). The ‘prospectively best’ option is to be understood in terms of the maximization of expectable value given the level of evidence available to the agent in question at the time of his action. Zimmerman grants that “on many occasions attending to the available evidence remains a difficult task” and he has no definitive account of the availability or nature of evidence to complete his account (70). I will say more about this issue below. Even granting these deficiencies, the above formulation of what is prospectively best is not without qualification, insofar as Zimmerman says that this formulation must be “adjusted in whatever way is necessary” for three problems he raises to be “adequately accommodated” (56). These three problems are:

(i) the possibility that some prospects are so momentously bad or good in terms of their evident value that no matter how low the probability of their attainment, they overwhelm all other considerations (52);

(ii) the fact that consistency sometimes requires individuals to sometimes act against expected utility (53); and

(iii) the possibility that two equally probable outcomes of equal probable value may differ in the reliability of their respective evidences (53).

While these considerations are dealt with in greater detail Chapter Three, because they are noted but not incorporated into the formulation and development of the Prospective View in the initial chapter, the argument there is a less than complete argument for the superiority of the Prospective View over its alternatives.

Chapter Two, “Risk and Rights”, focuses on the relation between prima facie moral obligations, as understood by the Prospective View, and moral rights. Since the account of moral obligation developed in Chapter One holds that what one is obligated to do "is itself in part a function of the evidence that is available to us, … it follows that the rights that others hold against us are themselves in part a function of the evidence available to us" (xii). Zimmerman also accepts both the Correlativity Thesis and a version of the Risk Thesis:

Correlativity Thesis: One person, Q, has a moral right against another person, P, that P perform some act, A, if and only if P has an obligation to Q to perform A (78).

Risk Thesis (third formulation): We have moral rights against others that they not impose on us any risk by virtue of their failing to do what is prospectively most suitable to some aspect of their situation, when such failure constitutes the failure to satisfy an associative obligation that they owe to us (87).

Zimmerman then shows how this results in some rather surprising implications for the question of what rights others hold against us when we borrow something from them and for the question of what rights we have to kill others in self-defense. For example, there can be circumstances where one person, Brenda, can be justified overall in killing another person, Alf, in self-defense even though Alf did not pose a threat to Brenda’s life — so long as in light of all the evidence available to Brenda it is the case that Alf’s behavior does impose a grave risk of harm to her (110f).

Chapter Three, “Prospective Possibilism”, develops the Prospective View in greater detail, with particular regard to the debate between Actualists and Possibilitists. According to Actualism, "an agent ought to perform an act if and only if it is an option such that what would happen if the agent performed it is better than what would happen if he did not perform it" (119). In contrast, Possibilism holds that "an agent ought to perform an act if and only if it is an option such that what could happen if the agent performed it is better than what could happen if he did not perform it" (119). Zimmerman endorses a probabilized version of Possibilism which holds that

an agent ought to perform an act if and only if every maximal course of action performable by the agent that does not include the act is inferior (in respect of what is relevant to the determination of overall moral obligation) to some maximal course of action performable by the agent that does include the act (128).

Here, the various courses of action are evaluated according to the epistemic probability of them happening according to the evidence available to the agent. This probabilized version of Possibilism yields the following eighth (but not yet final) formulation of the Prospective View:

An agent, P, ought at some time, T, to do some act, A, at some time, T* (which may or may not be later than T), if and only if

(1) P can at T do A at T*,

(2) P can at T refrain from doing A at T*, and

(3) for every maximal course of action, C, that P can at T perform and which excludes P‘s doing A at T*, there is some maximal course of action C*, such that

a. P can at T perform C*,

b. C* includes P’s doing A at T*, and

c. C* is prospectively better, for P at T, than C (128f).

(The ninth and final formulation of the Prospective View focuses on attempts rather than actions, but is otherwise parallel to the above formulation.) Zimmerman also extends the Prospective View to cover not only unconditional overall moral obligation (as in the above formulation), but also unconditional prima facie obligation, unconditional overall rightness, unconditional overall wrongness, conditional overall obligation, and subsidiary obligations. In the second half of Chapter Three, Zimmerman uses the Prospective View to argue that the strongest argument against the principle that ought implies can, which he calls the Argument of Self-imposed Impossibility, fails. Zimmerman’s response is too detailed for me to describe here, but at the heart of it is the claim that “wrongdoing and the failure to fulfill an obligation are not as closely related as is usually assumed” (153). It is worth pointing out, however, that Zimmerman’s treatment of this issue explicitly departs from the theory of obligation he defends in earlier work (for example, The Concept of Moral Obligation, Cambridge University Press, 1996) insofar as the earlier treatment presupposed the Objective View that he here rejects.

In the final chapter, “Ignorance and Responsibility”, Zimmerman turns from a discussion of moral obligation to backward-looking moral responsibility. Through a discussion of the epistemic condition on moral responsibility, Zimmerman argues that one can do wrong in failing to keep a moral obligation without being morally responsible (that is, blameworthy) for that failing. While on the Prospective View, one’s moral obligation depends primarily upon the evidence available regarding one’s options for action, rather than one’s beliefs or the moral facts about those options, Zimmerman argues blameworthiness is a function of one’s beliefs, not one’s evidence for those beliefs:

Even on those occasions where one’s obligations are knowable, it may still of course happen that one doesn’t know what one ought to do; for one’s beliefs may fail to comport with one’s evidence. Thus it is possible for someone to do something that is morally wrong without believing that it is morally wrong (173).

Zimmerman then argues that while it is possible for one to be culpable for the fact that one’s beliefs don’t comport with one’s evidence, such culpability is much rarer than is commonly supposed. Crucial at this point is what Zimmerman calls ‘the Origination Thesis’:

Every chain of responsibility is such that at its origin lies an item of behavior for which the agent is directly culpable and which the agent believed, at the time at which the behavior occurred, to be overall morally wrong (176).

Nevertheless, claims Zimmerman, “ignorant behavior is rarely to be traced to a non-ignorant origin” (176). The argument for the Origination Thesis is as follows:

(1) Suppose that an agent, Alf, does an immoral action A, but was ignorant of the moral status of the action at the time which he performed it.

(2) Alf is morally culpable for an immoral action done out of ignorance only if he is morally culpable for the ignorance from which that action was performed.

(3) Hence, Alf is culpable for his doing A only if he is culpable for his ignorance which led him to do A.

(4) Alf is culpable for something only if he was in control of that thing.

(5)Therefore, Alf is culpable for his doing A only if he was in direct control of his failing to believe that doing A was morally wrong or was indirectly in control of his failing to believe that doing A was morally wrong.

(6) If Alf was indirectly in control of his failing to believe that doing A was morally wrong, then that indirect failing would itself have to be ultimately grounded in an action for which he had direct control.

(7) Therefore, Alf is culpable for doing A "only if there was some other act or omission, B, for which he is directly culpable and of which his failure to believe that A was wrong was a consequence, and B was such that Alf believed it at the time to be wrong" (176).

According to Zimmerman, such tracing of ignorance to a non-ignorant origin is rare, though he later grants that this is an empirical issue that he will not attempt to defend. So one way to resist the argument for the Origination Thesis is through a consideration of the relative frequency of such actions. Another would be via a virtue-based account regarding the types of agents we ought to be in general, and, more specifically, the kinds of considerations we ought to give to future implications of the kinds of moral character we presently develop. One could also argue, as Aquinas does, that ignorance does not excuse if it is irrelevant to what the agent does — i.e., however the ignorance is brought about, if the agent would have acted the same way had she not been ignorant, then the ignorance does contribute to non-culpability.2

Zimmerman’s arguments are dense and it becomes difficult to keep track of the various formulations of his account (there are, for example, at least nine formulations of the Prospective View, many of which have six conditions and ten different thought experiments, one of which comes in eight different permutations); as a result, this book isn’t for the faint of heart or the uninitiated. Furthermore, there is a significant lacuna that makes it difficult to properly evaluate his argument for the Prospective View. At the heart of the Prospective View is the claim that an agent’s moral obligations depend on the evidence that is ‘available’ to her, but what exactly does available evidence amount to?

It is with considerable chagrin … that I concede that I have little to say by way of clarifying this crucial concept. What follows is very meager, although I hope it will be of some use and that it is consistent with the best theory of evidence that epistemologists have to offer. Evidence that is available to one person may not be available to another… It is the evidence that is immediately available to the agent that determines that agent’s obligation. We must distinguish between evidence that is available to someone and evidence of which that person in fact avails himself. Available evidence of which someone can, in some sense, and ought, in some sense, to avail himself. I confess that the exact sense of this ‘can’ and ‘ought’ elude me (35f).

Without such an account of what makes evidence ‘available evidence’, however, the Prospective View is incomplete at best, and impossible to evaluate at worst. This unfortunate lacuna is a serious drawback to Zimmerman’s project.

Nevertheless, for many scholars interested in various aspects of ethics (e.g., the Objective vs. Subjective vs. Prospective View), as well as those interested in the connections between ignorance and moral obligation, this book contains a wealth of arguments. Furthermore, it contains a number of helpful discussions that will be of interest to a wider audience. For example, Chapter Two addresses ways that we can lose rights that we have neither forfeited nor waved, and the end of Chapter Three contains a very useful discussion of the distinction between the extinction of an obligation and the supersession of that obligation. Also, the extended discussion of the epistemic condition on moral responsibility helps to fill what is an unfortunately underdeveloped aspect of current scholarship on moral responsibility. As the above discussion makes clear, however, extracting some of these discussions from the larger, somewhat circuitous defense of the Prospective View will require some effort.3

1 Frank Jackson, “Decision-theoretic Consequentialism and the Nearest and Dearest Objection”, Ethics 101 (1991): 462-463.

2 See Aquinas, Summa Theologiae IaIIae q.6 a.8; for a discussion of another kind of culpable ignorance which calls into question the Origination Thesis, see Summa Theologiae IaIIae q.76 a.3.

3 My thanks to Tim Pawl for numerous extensive and helpful comments on a previous draft of this review.