Living Without Free Will

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Pereboom, Derk, Living Without Free Will, Cambridge University Press, 2001, 256 pp, $54.95 (hbk), ISBN 0-521-79198-7

Reviewed by Erik Carlson, Uppsala


Derk Pereboom’s recent book is a defence of “hard incompatibilism”. This is the position that moral responsibility is incompatible with determinism, as well as with the kind of indeterminism implied by the standard interpretation of quantum mechanics. There is another kind of indeterminism, which is compatible with moral responsibility. Such indeterminism might obtain if the hypothesis of agent-causation is true. However, the empirical evidence tells strongly against this hypothesis. Hence, Pereboom concludes, we are probably not morally responsible for any of our actions.

In the first chapter, Pereboom distinguishes between “leeway incompatibilism” and “causal-history” incompatibilism. Leeway incompatibilism claims that moral responsibility presupposes alternative possibilities for action, and that alternative possibilities are precluded by determinism. Pereboom rejects the first of these claims. He constructs “Frankfurt-style” examples, aiming to show that a person can be morally responsible for an action, although he could not have acted otherwise. Causal-history incompatibilism, which is the view favoured by Pereboom, maintains that an agent is morally responsible only if he is the ultimate causal source of his action, and that determinism is incompatible with agents’ being such ultimate sources. In Chapter 2, Pereboom goes on to argue that if actions are caused exclusively by events, rather than by agents, indeterminism leaves no room for moral responsibility. On the event-causal version of indeterminism, our actions are at least partially random events. This element of randomness cannot provide an agent with the kind of control necessary for her being the ultimate source of her action. Agent-causation, on the other hand, could give agents the required control over the production of their actions. Pereboom acknowledges the coherence of agent-causation, but argues, in Chapter 3, that there is strong (but not conclusive) empirical evidence against it. In Chapter 4, two forms of compatibilism concerning determinism and moral responsibility are criticized. Against the “reactive attitudes” account of moral responsibility, Pereboom argues, in opposition to P. F. Strawson, that these attitudes would and should be affected by a universal belief in determinism. The “causal integrationist” account is faulted for not providing sufficient conditions for moral responsibility. Hence, this account does not succeed in specifying conditions under which an agent is both determined and morally responsible.

In the remaining three chapters, the implications of hard incompatibilism are discussed. Pereboom argues, in Chapter 5, that rejecting the existence of moral responsibility threatens neither our conception of ourselves as deliberative agents, nor plausible moral principles and values. Chapter 6 deals with hard incompatibilism in relation to criminal behaviour. It is argued that severe punishment, such as death or confinement in the ordinary type of prisons, is ruled out, but that preventive detention and rehabilitation programs are justifiable. In Chapter 7, finally, Pereboom argues that accepting hard incompatibilism does not threaten our prospects of finding meaning in life or of sustaining good interpersonal relationships. On the contrary, embracing hard incompatibilism might well improve our well-being and our relationships to others, Pereboom claims, since it would tend to eradicate an often destructive form of “moral anger”.

This is an impressive book, which can be recommended to all philosophers interested in the problems surrounding freedom and moral responsibility. It covers a lot of ground, the level of argumentation is generally high, and the author has interesting things to say about several much-discussed topics, such as the status of Frankfurt-style cases, event-causal versus agent-causal libertarianism, and causal integrationist versions of compatibilism. Having stated my high opinion of the book, I shall make two critical comments.

A weakness in Pereboom’s defence of causal-history incompatibilism is that it seems to implicitly rely on the thesis that determinism is incompatible with alternative possibilities, or, in other words, with the claim that an agent could have acted otherwise than he actually did. Pereboom does not argue for this thesis. In fact, he claims that its truth is immaterial to the correctness of causal-history incompatibilism. (pp. 36-37) This claim is, I believe, mistaken. Causal-history incompatibilism essentially relies on the “Causal History Principle”:

An action is free in the sense required for moral responsibility only if the decision to perform it is not an alien-deterministic event, nor a truly random event, nor a partially random event. (p. 54)

An “alien-deterministic” event is an event “for which factors beyond the agent’s control determine [its] occurrence”. (p. 48) We cannot be morally responsible for alien-deterministic events, since moral responsibility presupposes control over the production of one’s decision. Thus:

(O) If an agent is morally responsible for her deciding to perform an action, then the production of this decision must be something over which the agent has control, and an agent is not morally responsible for the decision if it is produced by a source over which she has no control. (p. 4)

In Pereboom’s view, “(O) expresses the most fundamental and plausible incompatibilist intuition about how an agent’s moral responsibility is grounded”. (p. 5)

Now, Pereboom simply takes for granted that if determinism is true, then all our decisions are alien-deterministic events. It is not clear exactly on what grounds he makes this assumption, since he does not explain what he means by “determinism”, or by a factor’s being “beyond the agent’s control”. He appears to hold, however, that an obtaining causal factor is beyond an agent’s control only if she could not have prevented it from obtaining. (pp. 88, 112) As for the notion of determinism, he seems to have a standard definition in mind, according to which determinism is the thesis that a proposition expressing the total state of the world at an arbitrary moment, in conjunction with a proposition expressing the laws of nature, entail any proposition expressing the total state of the world at any other moment. (p. 36)

On this standard version of determinism, then, all our decisions are determined by the past and the laws. Compatibilists concerning determinism and alternative possibilities will deny, however, that our decisions are therefore produced by factors that are beyond our control, in the sense that we cannot prevent their obtaining. Even if determinism is true, such compatibilists claim, we can decide and act otherwise than we actually do. And were we to act otherwise, the conjunction of the (actual) past and the (actual) laws would not obtain. Hence, we can prevent this conjunction from obtaining. Thus, if determinism and alternative possibilities are compatible, determinism does not imply that all our decisions are alien-deterministic events, and the Causal History Principle cannot be invoked to establish that determinism is incompatible with moral responsibility. In the absence of an argument against the compatibility between determinism and alternative possibilities, Pereboom’s defence of incompatibilism is therefore seriously incomplete.

My second criticism concerns what I take to be a weak point in Pereboom’s argument against agent-causal libertarianism. If agent-causation is to provide us with the kind of control necessary for moral responsibility, we must, according to Pereboom, assume either “strong emergentism” or non-physicalism, and claim that agent-causal powers are not wholly constrained by microphysical laws. Pereboom’s objection to the strong emergentist and non-physicalist views of agent-causes is that we would have to accept “wild coincidences”, in order to square these views with the empirical evidence suggesting that our world is wholly governed by the laws of physics. If the causal powers of agents were not constrained by deterministic or statistical microphysical laws, there would almost certainly be observable deviations, in the course of natural events, from what can be predicted on the basis of these laws. Since we observe no such deviations, it is very unlikely that agents have causal powers that are not wholly constrained by microphysical laws.

A possible rejoinder to this argument is to “claim that the antecedent probabilities match up with causal factors that incline but do not determine agent-causes to act, such as reasons they have for acting”. (p. 84) Pereboom argues, however, that this suggestion provides no solution to the wild coincidences objection:

Even if the strength of the inclining causes is reflected in the antecedent probabilities, we would expect evidence of the effect of the additional causal factor, the agent-cause, to show up in the long run in the actual frequencies of choice. If the agent-causal libertarian would have it that in the long run this evidence does not show up, […] then his proposal, again, involves wild coincidences that make it incredible. (p. 85)

This argument is contestable. Suppose that an action’s antecedent probability, as determined by the microphysical laws, always coincides with the combined strength of certain microphysically constituted factors, inclining the agent to perform the action. Although agent-causes by hypothesis act freely, and thus are not constrained by the inclining factors, it would be very peculiar if the strength of these factors were not reflected by the relative frequency of choice. Arguably, this relative frequency will in the long run tend to coincide with the antecedent probability. Consider the class of possible actions with a certain antecedent probability; 0.68, say. On the present hypothesis, each of these actions is such that its agent is antecedently “inclined to 68 percent” to perform it. It seems reasonable to assume that these actions will tend to be freely chosen in 68 percent of the cases, at least if the relevant class of possible actions is large. Contrary to Pereboom’s claim, then, it is far from clear that we should expect evidence of the effect of the agent-cause to show up in the frequency of choice. (It remains, of course, for the agent-causal libertarian to explain why the antecedent probabilities match the strength of the inclining factors.)