Living Without Why: Meister Eckhart’s Critique of the Medieval Concept of Will

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John M. Connolly, Living Without Why: Meister Eckhart’s Critique of the Medieval Concept of Will, Oxford University Press, 2014, 236pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199359783.

Reviewed by Peter Eardley, University of Guelph


One of the more fertile areas of research in medieval philosophy today falls under the broad umbrella of moral psychology. Although no one can say for sure, one of the reasons for such interest presumably has something to do with the perennial relevance of questions about the freedom of the will, the role of the emotions in the moral life, the nature of the virtues, and the question of moral weakness, all issues that received serious treatment during the medieval period. Hence, since about the mid-1990s, there has been a real resurgence of interest in this area of medieval philosophy, the work of Bonnie Kent (1995), Risto Saarinen (1994), F.-X. Putallaz (1995), and many others immediately coming to mind. Moreover, interest in the topic shows few signs of abating.

Now one might think that John M. Connolly’s monograph would represent a contribution to this ongoing area of research, putatively treating as it does "the medieval concept of will" that was "critiqued" by the German theologian Meister Eckhart (ca. 1260-1328). But that it does so, or indeed that it is even intended to do so, is not entirely clear. And a major reason for this is that there is, despite the title of Connolly’s monograph, no such thing as "the" medieval concept of "will". Rather, there are several such conceptions. For Augustine (if one counts him as a medieval thinker) will (voluntas) is not a capacity of the soul as it was for those who embraced a faculty psychology. Instead, for Augustine, will is conceived as the entire soul as active and therefore the seat of human freedom. St. Anselm would later think of the will in similar terms. Thomas Aquinas, by contrast, did adhere to a faculty psychology of the soul. For him, the will is a rational appetite, or inclination towards objects that are apprehended as good. Accordingly voluntas for Aquinas is, at least in his earlier works, a passive power that requires reduction from potency to act by the rationally appetible object. Several major contemporaries and near contemporaries would bitterly contest Aquinas’s "intellectualistic" picture of the will and human action from a "voluntaristic" perspective, viewing the Thomistic account as a version of cognitive determinism that was insufficient to guarantee moral responsibility. In response, voluntarists such as the Franciscan Peter John Olivi (ca. 1248-1298) and the secular master Henry of Ghent (ca. 1217-1293) argued that the will was a self-moving power for opposites that was essentially autonomous with respect to the intellect. Unlike Augustine, however, they defended this radically free conception of the will within a faculty psychology that saw voluntas as a distinct power of the soul.

Now even within these broad categories of "voluntarism" and "intellectualism" one will naturally find different shades of emphasis. The intellectualist Godfrey of Fontaines, for example, arguably defended an even more passive conception of the will than Aquinas, since the former held the intellect to move the will after the manner of an efficient cause, while the latter merely attributed to the intellect’s determination of the will final and formal causation. How did Godfrey ground freedom? Through the immateriality of the soul. In contrast to Henry of Ghent and Olivi, on the other hand, Giles of Rome (ca. 1243-1316) defended a more moderate version of voluntarism according to which the will, although necessitated to choose the final end as apprehended by the intellect, nonetheless has formal freedom with respect to the means to happiness. In this way Giles attempted to preserve both the rationality of choice as well as the freedom and autonomy of the will. And these are just a few of the better known examples of the various conceptions of the will that were in play during Eckhart’s lifetime, as Kent and others have shown.

Connolly has nothing to say about any of this. To a specialist in the field this will seem odd, if not confusing. But in fact Connolly has something quite different in mind by "the medieval concept of will" than reference to metaphysical worries about whether voluntas was free or not. Rather, his concern is predominantly ethical, "the medieval concept of will" essentially being shorthand for the tradition of teleological eudaimonism. According to this tradition, the good life for human beings consists in making choices that will lead to human flourishing or happiness (eudaimonia; beatitudo; felicitas). Such a purposive, goal-directed life specifically involves the practice of the virtues. Moreover, it places the will at its centre, according to Connolly, because voluntas (in the Latin tradition; boulesis in the Greek) is the rational desire that directs rational agents towards their final end -- the "why" of their existence.

There is some debate over whether Aristotle has a concept of the will in the medieval sense, or even anticipates such a conception. Connolly nonetheless devotes a background chapter to Aristotle’s teleological eudaimonism, as he does to Augustine’s, who also conceived of human life as directed toward a final end, although, in contrast to Aristotle, regarded this end as only truly achieved in the hereafter. Now for all that Connolly devotes a fair bit of attention to Aristotle and Augustine (17-41 and 42-85, respectively), the principal representative of the tradition of teleological eudaimonism that Connolly argues Eckhart will reject is that of Eckhart’s illustrious Dominican predecessor, Aquinas. For Connolly, Aquinas’s action theory, which is treated in Chapter 3, is nothing less than "a kind of zenith of Christian teleological eudaimonism" (98), according to which the will plays the role of an inherent power that inclines humans to choose in all of their actions, whether they are conscious of this or not, their final end of happiness (beatitudo), understood as an uncreated good that is external to the soul, namely the Beatific Vision (visio Dei). Hence, Eckhart’s "critique of the medieval concept of will" is really for Connolly a dissatisfaction with the Thomistic version of Christian eudaimonism, which represents "the very acme" of "living with a why" (97). Aquinas’s eudaimonism turns out to be a sort of moral instrumentalism in which virtue becomes a tool for happiness, as opposed to being constitutive of it, as it was for Aristotle.

What precisely did Eckhart find objectionable about Aquinas’s eudaimonistic ethic? Not that it was eudaimonistic as such, according to Connolly, but that, to the extent that it was oriented toward an external reward -- the Beatific Vision -- it was mercenary. In being motivated by "profit" or "reward", these "spiritual merchants" (134) mistake both what they are, as well as their relationship to God. That is, "They take themselves to be ‘servants and hirelings’ (servi et mercennarii) who are ‘beneath God’ (sub deo), when in fact they are by nature ‘Sons’ who are ‘with God’ (apud deum)" (171). Moreover in being moved by self-interest, their motives are far from pure (134).

Eckhart therefore contrasts Aquinas’s "spiritual merchant", who is motivated by reward for his virtuous efforts, with the "just person" (der Gerehte) who "lives without why". As Eckhart puts it, as quoted by Connolly, "[The just person] wants and seeks nothing, for he knows no why. He acts without a why just in the same way as God does; and just as life lives for its own sake and seeks no why for the sake of which it lives, so too the just person knows no why for the sake of which he would do something" (135). How is all of this accomplished? Through a life of "detachment" (abgescheidenheit) or "going out of oneself" (136) when practicing the virtues. In this way the just agent is "one with God", the latter of whom also acts without why, that is, simply from motives of justice for its own sake, rather than out of consideration for external reward. Eckhart is no mystic, then, who advocates withdrawal from the world. Rational agents must engage with the world and practice the virtues, though without, as mentioned, any thought of reward. To be motivated in this way is to act "divinely" (207), and ultimately to dissolve into "absolutely unified being," (164): the state in which true happiness consists. Eckhart does not so much reject the eudaimonistic tradition as such, although his eudaimonism is admittedly, according to Connolly, a "somewhat peculiar" (168) one.

On the whole, Connolly’s book is well written, if synoptic at times, and offers readers a useful overview of Aristotelian, Augustinian, and Thomistic ethics. Moreover, it generally does a good job of analysing the subtle and not-so-subtle variations amongst these theories. That it focuses on the ethical work of Meister Eckhart, an important medieval thinker, though one who is too often neglected in the literature, is salutary.

If I have a complaint it is that Connolly’s choice of Aquinas’s theory of ethics and human action to represent "the medieval concept of will" seems a bit ad hoc. He tells us that he employs Aquinas’s intellective appetite conception of the will to represent the entire tradition because "it is widely recognised for its comprehensive and definitive character" (9). But this needs to be seriously qualified given that Aquinas’s views on the will as a passive potency are generally agreed to have been implicated in the condemnations of 1277 at Paris. By Eckhart’s time, indeed, arguably the dominant conception of the will was not the Thomistic "intellectualistic" picture, but a more "voluntaristic" conception according to which the will is able to act in an autonomous fashion, as noted above. Indeed, one of the most prominent representatives of the voluntarist line was undoubtedly Eckhart’s contemporary, the Franciscan John Duns Scotus (1265-1308), who posited, following Anselm, two fundamental inclinations within the will: the "affection for the advantageous" (affectio commodi) or natural inclination towards self-perfection, which was more or less equivalent to Aquinas’s understanding of the will as a rational appetite, and the "affection for justice" (affectio iustitiae), an inclination towards the good in itself, which Scotus associated with the "innate freedom of the will."

If this thumbnail sketch of Scotus’s theory of the two affections of the will is accurate, then one has to admit that Scotus’s theory rather resembles Eckhart’s distinction between spiritual mercantilism, or the inclination to act out of self-interest, and the capacity or inclination to act for the sake of justice itself. But one might wonder what exactly the psychological mechanism is for this dual motivational structure in the case of Eckhart and, indeed, what sort of implications such an account might have for his ethical theory as a whole. For Scotus’s part, Anselm’s two affections theory is invoked to ground his account of the radical freedom of the will. Moreover, Scotus’s embrace of a two-affections theory had consequences: it meant that he was required to separate morality from happiness and therefore break with the eudaimonistic tradition, in contrast to Aquinas on whose account of the will rational agents are necessitated to choose the final end. Eckhart, on the other hand, despite his similarities to Scotus, appears to have maintained a basically Thomistic, rational appetite view of the will (181), as well as a (admittedly peculiar) form of eudaimonistic ethics. One might well wonder, in short, whether Eckhart’s implicit embrace of a two affections theory leads to tensions within his ethical system, a possibility that might have been worth exploring.

Connolly concludes his monograph by likening Eckhart to Kant (210-212), who is also well known for having separated morality from happiness. It would have been a bit more historically accurate, perhaps, to have compared Eckhart to his contemporary Scotus, at least on the relationship of the will to human happiness.


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P.S. Eardley, "Happiness," in The Oxford Guide to the Historical Reception of Augustine. Eds. K. Pollmann et al. 3 vols. Oxford: Oxford University Press: 2: 605-609.

--- (2003). "Thomas Aquinas and Giles of Rome on the Will," Review of Metaphysics 56, 835-862.

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B. Kent (1995). Virtues of the Will: The Transformation of Ethics in the Late Thirteenth Century. Washington, D.C.: The Catholic University of America Press.

F.-X. Putallaz (1995). Insolente liberté. Controverses et condamnations au XIII siècle. Paris: Éditions du Cerf.

R. Saarinen (1994). Weakness of Will in Medieval Thought: From Augustine to Buridan. Leiden: Brill.

T. Williams (1995). "How Scotus Separates Morality from Happiness," American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly 69, 425-445.