Locke: A Biography

Placeholder book cover

Roger Woolhouse, Locke: A Biography, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 528pp., $39.99 (hbk), ISBN 9780521817868.

Reviewed by John Milton, King's College London


Despite the copious documentation available, Locke is not an easy subject for a biographer.  He was a very cautious and self-controlled man -- 'a master of taciturnity and passion' in the words of one of his hostile (and frustrated) contemporaries -- and though he would probably have been horrified by the thought of later biographers reading his journals and private letters, and even deciphering his shorthand, considerably less emerges from these than perhaps he might have feared.  There are some biographical subjects who seem naturally to spring to life off the page -- Samuel Johnson is one, Oscar Wilde another.  Both men even in their lifetimes became the focus of stories, zealously recorded, embroidered, or even invented by their contemporaries.  There is nothing like this for Locke, or at least very little, and although he lived a far more eventful and exciting life than almost any modern academic philosopher -- this reviewer included -- the nature of the available sources places any biographer in danger of producing a dry factual narrative, laboriously constructed and (alas) laborious to read.

The last general biography of Locke, by Maurice Cranston, was published exactly fifty years ago, and its strengths and weaknesses have long been known.  It provides a clear and vivid account of Locke's personality and of the events of his life, is much weaker on his involvement in public affairs, and frankly inadequate on his intellectual development.  Roger Woolhouse's new life has many of the same virtues and some of the same faults, though the discussion of technical philosophical matters is much crisper, as befits a professional philosopher.  Woolhouse clearly admires and respects Locke, but he is quite prepared to be harsh if the occasion requires: in one place Locke is described (entirely justifiably in my view) as tending to side-step the issues raised by Limborch in connection with the freedom of the will, and of being 'patronisingly superior' in his replies to the real difficulties that his old friend had raised.

Cranston's biography was one of the first books to make use of the Locke papers deposited in the Bodleian Library.  During the last half-century, many other scholars concerned with particular aspects of Locke's life and works have laboured with this material, and with other Locke papers elsewhere, and much that was obscure or even unthought-of in 1957 has now been elucidated, or at least thoroughly discussed.  Woolhouse has been able to make good use of the work of these scholars, though there are some surprising gaps, in particular several very important papers by Mark Goldie, among them 'John Locke's circle and James II', Historical Journal, 1992.

Cranston's main sources for his biography were Locke's journal and his correspondence.  The journal remains unpublished, though more extracts have been printed since Cranston wrote, but E. S. de Beer's magnificent edition of the correspondence is now available, and Woolhouse makes good use of it.  These are volumes that one dips into rather than reads steadily through for pleasure, and though I have myself been consulting them for years, I was pleased to find Woolhouse drawing to my attention passages that I had never noticed; I am sure many other readers will be similarly enlightened.  The letters and the journal are, however, not the only sources available, especially for the earlier part of Locke's life (the journal only begins in November 1675, when he was forty-three).  The main evidence for Locke's intellectual development in these years is provided by his commonplace books, and although the dating of entries in these is a complex and intricate business, it can be done.  Cranston used this material, but in a casual and wholly inadequate way.  Woolhouse, with much less excuse, has gone backwards even from this: a reader of the biography with no independent knowledge of Locke's papers would not realise even that this material existed.  This is not the only respect in which the book is thinly documented -- the Shaftesbury papers in the National Archives have been used, but only in a rather desultory way, and the accounts of Locke's years at both Exeter House (1667-75) and at Thanet House (1679-83) suffer accordingly.  Locke's relations with his patron are a central issue in his biography, and a satisfactory account has to be based on a thorough analysis of the manuscript evidence.  This has not been provided, or even attempted.

One striking feature of the book, which will presumably be discussed by reviewers elsewhere, is that Woolhouse is clearly unpersuaded by Richard Ashcraft's lurid (though superficially well-documented) account of Locke as Shaftesbury's closest political advisor, fellow-plotter, and intimate associate of malcontents from 'radical' tinkers and cobblers up to the Duke of Monmouth.  He is entirely right to be suspicious, but Ashcraft's account has been so influential that it would have been better to show why it is unfounded.  Apart from Ashcraft's Revolutionary Politics & Locke's Two Treatises of Government, published in 1986, no use has been made of any of the large quantity of excellent work that has been done on post-Restoration England during the last thirty years: the background narrative is provided largely by David Ogg (1955, 1956) and K. H. D. Haley (1968).

Writing a satisfactory biography of a philosopher -- or indeed of any thinker -- is never easy: either one has periodically to stop the narrative in order to give an account of the contents of the works being written, or else one has to skimp on the main thing that made the person deserving of a biography in the first place.  Woolhouse, rightly, has chosen the former approach, and done his best to give an account of Locke's philosophical development.  A detailed discussion of Draft A of the Essay is provided (though Woolhouse is almost certainly mistaken in supposing that the beginning of this is the 'hasty and undigested thoughts' famously described in the Epistle to the Reader: Locke wouldn't have used one of his commonplace books for such a draft, and what we have is clearly a fair copy, though subsequently revised).  The account of Draft B is briefer, and that of Draft C (1685) wholly inadequate: Woolhouse simply states that this 'is close enough [to the published Essay] for a general appreciation of its contents to be got by referring to that later form' (p. 224), and accordingly bases his discussion entirely on the published version.  The differences between Draft C and the 1690 text are much more interesting than this implies, but the latter is undeniably easier to consult.

Several features of the book make it less than user-friendly -- indeed make it thoroughly annoying to use.  The chief of these is the use of endnotes, rather than footnotes.  I realise that this is a feature of the series in which the book appears (though one can still ask, why?), but other volumes in the series do at least have running heads on the pages containing the endnotes to indicate which pages of the main text they relate to.  This volume does not: a reader trying to locate a note has to turn to the end of the book, go back through the notes to find the number of the chapter to which it relates (not the title, which is not indicated), and then try to remember the number of the chapter he is reading (for which the running heads in the chapter itself give no help).  A purely commercial publisher like Longmans could put notes at the foot of the page in Cranston's biography, even though this was technically quite tricky in the 1950s.  It is now easy, but the publishing arm of one of the world's great universities can't be bothered.  Cambridge University Press should be thoroughly ashamed of themselves.

When one has at last located the endnotes, further problems arise from Woolhouse's decision to use Harvard-style references in which works are identified by an author's name and a date, often with a supernumerary letter, so that (for example) the first edition of Locke's Essay becomes 'Locke 1690b'.  Scientists invariably use this method, which enables them to dispense with footnotes, but professional historians almost always avoid it, for reasons that quickly become apparent if one surveys some of the difficulties that Woolhouse is led into.  Consider for example the Fundamental Constitutions of Carolina, a work of composite and disputed authorship in which Locke certainly had a hand.  Woolhouse's method of citation requires that it should be attributed to a single author, so it is cited as 'Shaftesbury 1669', but though this might seem to suggest that the 1669 version of this is going to be used, in fact it is the (considerably revised) 1670 version that is quoted, though not from the first printing but from a later and less reliable text in the 1823 edition of Locke's works.  The manuscript of the 1669 version in the National Archives (PRO 30/24/47/3), with its large additions and alterations in Locke's hand, is never mentioned, let alone given the analysis it requires, and no reference is made to a very important recent study by David Armitage, 'John Locke, Carolina, and the Two Treatises of Government', in Political Theory, 2004.

Though the reader is not alerted to this, the dates used in these references are of very varied significance.  Sometimes, as in 'Locke 1690b' they are the publication years of a particular edition (which may have been long after Locke's death: the translation of Nicole's Essais de morale is cited as 'Locke 1828', even though we know that it was made in 1676).  In other cases they are years when a work was written, or at least conjectured to have been written.  (The Elements of Natural Philosophy is cited as 'Locke 1698', apparently solving the minor mystery of its date of composition, even though no evidence is provided that it was written then.)  Sometimes they are the year in which a work was actually published, so that the Two Treatises of Government is cited as 'Locke 1689d', presumably on the grounds that the first edition went on sale in November 1689, even though the date on its title-page is 1690; this practice is not consistently followed, however: the Second Reply to Stillingfleet is cited as 'Locke 1699b', though it went on sale in November 1698.  Unpublished manuscripts sometimes get the same treatment, with bizarre results: the journal for 1689-1704, Bodl., MS Locke f. 10, is cited successively as 'Locke 1689a', 'Locke 1690a', 'Locke 1691a', and so on.

Where a modern critical edition is available it is sometimes used, though not always; otherwise recourse is generally made to the 1823 edition, even though anyone who has collated anything in this with the originals from which it was ultimately derived will be aware that it is not to be relied on.  Some of the volumes in the Clarendon Edition appear not to have been consulted, and have certainly not been used: the passages quoted from Drafts A and B of the Essay are not taken from the edition by Peter Nidditch and G. A. J. Rogers, but from a microfilm of the manuscript for Draft A and the old and inaccurate edition by Benjamin Rand for Draft B, while quotations from Some Thoughts concerning Education and the Reasonableness of Christianity are taken from the 1823 edition, not from the critical editions by John and Jean Yolton and by John Higgins-Biddle.  There really is no excuse for this, especially as Higgins-Biddle's edition is listed in the bibliography (the Yoltons' edition is not, though it does seem to have been consulted: there is a citation from it on p. 495).  Perhaps most strangely of all, the edition apparently used (in ch. 4 at least, though not in ch. 6) for citations from the Two Treatises of Government is the 1823 edition, not the ground-breaking one produced by Peter Laslett (though it is difficult to be sure: if Laslett's edition has been used, the quotations have been thoroughly modernised).

However hard one tries, when producing a volume of this size it is almost impossible to avoid errors creeping through, and since CUP is providing a list of errata on-line, it is worth giving details of some of the ones not so far included.  Several people have names misspelt, notably Henri Justel and Sir William Trumbull, who invariably appear as 'Justell' and 'Trumbell'.  The journal in which Locke published in the 1680s was the Bibliothèque universelle et historique, not the (non-existent) Bibliothèque universelle de la Republique des Lettres.  Shaftesbury's political enemy was Thomas Osborne, Earl of Danby, not 'Thomas Danby'; whether deliberately or not, the titles of noblemen are generally given with a casualness that would have enraged their bearers, and there are two separate index entries for 'Montague, Ralph' and 'Montagu, Lord', though these are the same person.  John Ellis was not undersecretary of state when Humphrey Prideaux wrote to him in the early 1680s: he was secretary to the Duke of Ormonde.  The man whom Locke and Toinard referred to as 'le capitaine de marine' was Raymond Formentin, not John Brisbane.  John Covel was not Master of Christ Church, but of Christ's College.  The first name of the Lady King with whom Damaris Cudworth stayed while in London was Joyce, not Anne; she was the widow of Sir John King, who had helped Locke and Shaftesbury with legal matters.  Locke did not receive 'a college stipend of about £80 a quarter' from Christ Church: the amount varied from year to year but was generally less than £10.  The Traité des fièvres that Locke was reading during his visit to Wimborne St Giles after Shaftesbury's death was not by J. B. van Helmont but by Cornelis Bontekoe; Helmont wrote in Latin.  Thomas Willis's De Fermentatione was first published in 1659, not 1656.  Galileo did not show that the periodic time of a pendulum is proportional to its length: it is proportional to the square root of its length.  In the Julian calendar used in England the new year did not begin 'in April', but on 25 March.  The Ballard MSS are in the Bodleian, not the British Library.  'Sic Cogitavit de Intellectu humano Jo: Locke an 1671' does not mean 'What I think about the human understanding, John Locke, 1671', but rather 'Thus John Locke thought [or has thought] … ' (also in the manuscript 'an' has a line above it, so when printed should be expanded to 'anno' [in the year].)

There are several agreeable pages of illustrations, though it is unfortunate -- and perhaps rather worrying -- that the page chosen to illustrate Locke's accounts (Bodl., MS Locke f. 15, p. 50) is wholly in the hand of his manservant, Sylvester Brounower.

All in all, this is a useful addition to Locke studies.  It is based on quite wide, though insufficiently deep, research, and though there are more errors of fact than one would wish (the list given above is only a selection), the judgements are sober and cautious, and there is a complete and very welcome absence of ideologically driven fantasy.  Locke would have approved.