Locke and Cartesian Philosophy

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Philippe Hamou and Martine Pécharman (eds.), Locke and Cartesian Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2018, 227pp., $65.00, ISBN 9780198815037.

Reviewed by Matthew A. Leisinger, Emmanuel College, Cambridge


It is often said that, according to the standard narrative of early modern philosophy, Locke is the founder of British empiricism, the first member of a triumvirate that also includes Berkeley and Hume, and a prominent opponent of continental rationalists such as Descartes. This narrative has faced such persistent and incisive criticism, however, that it seems increasingly misleading to call it "standard". At the very least, virtually all Locke scholars will admit that there are significant so-called "rationalist" elements in Locke's An Essay Concerning Human Understanding. Some may even go so far as to label Locke himself a "rationalist". Most, I suspect, would simply question the usefulness of the distinction between rationalism and empiricism.

The book is a welcome contribution to this on-going reassessment. The twelve papers in it resolutely set aside hackneyed labels in favour of a more nuanced examination of the many complicated ways in which Locke engages both positively and negatively with Descartes (and, to some extent, Cartesian philosophy more generally).

The volume is particularly noteworthy for its thematic emphases. As Philippe Hamou and Martine Pécharman observe in their helpful introduction, Locke's relation to Descartes has often been viewed through a primarily epistemological lens, focusing for example on Locke's arguments against innate ideas in Essay 1 or his discussion of intuitive and demonstrative knowledge in Essay 4. Without denying the importance of these issues, the book advocates a "shift of emphasis" away from epistemology and towards "physical, metaphysical, and religious matters" (3). This shift is, I believe, richly rewarded.

The volume is most successful on questions of physics. The first five papers, comprising approximately half of the volume, constitute a remarkably unified, accessible, and illuminating survey of Locke's engagement with Cartesian physics. The survey begins on something of a biographical note: J. R. Milton masterfully reconstructs Locke's discovery of Cartesian physics in the early 1660s, and Peter R. Anstey leads us through Locke's evolving thoughts about the Cartesian theory of vortices. The third and fourth papers (both of which are models of philosophical clarity) then focus more narrowly on the philosophy of body: James Hill draws our attention to an important point of agreement between Locke and Descartes, while Lisa Downing provides a penetrating analysis of Locke's criticisms of Descartes's identification of body and extension. Finally, in a particularly rewarding paper, Martha Brandt Bolton argues for a deep -- and surprising -- similarity between Locke's and Descartes's respective accounts of the metaphysics of material substances. Taken together, these five papers paint an extraordinarily rich picture of Locke's relation to Cartesian physics.

The volume also has a lot to say about metaphysics. While the second half fails to achieve the remarkable degree of unity that characterizes the first, it contains several papers that fall broadly within the domain of metaphysics (as do several of the earlier papers, for that matter). I particularly enjoyed Hamou's provocative yet compelling argument for the claim that, in his account of the self in Essay 2.27 (conventionally thought to be one of the Essay's most anti-Cartesian chapters), "Locke was here perhaps closer to the true spirit of Cartesian philosophy than he ever was" (120).

Despite the introductory promise, the volume has rather less to say about "religious matters". Of the twelve papers, only Catherine Wilson's contribution takes up religious matters directly, and even this paper only argues for the relatively modest claim that Locke and Descartes share an "essential religiosity" (169). More generally, the volume exhibits a conspicuous absence of practical philosophy. To my mind, however, these are not serious complaints so much as opportunities for future investigation.

In sum, the book makes a significant contribution to our understanding of Locke's relation to Descartes. It will be particularly helpful to those interested in Locke's attitude towards Cartesian physics.

I turn now to individual chapters.

In "Locke and Descartes: The Initial Exposure, 1658-1671", Milton provides an extraordinarily careful analysis of the evidence for Locke's earliest exposure to Descartes's writings, which seems to have begun sometime in the early 1660s. Milton emphasizes that, at this point in his career, Locke seems to have been interested primarily in Descartes's natural philosophy, further claiming (albeit, he admits, rather more contentiously) that Locke "had at this stage no comparable interest in metaphysics" (29).

Anstey continues the emphasis on natural philosophy in "Locke and Cartesian Cosmology" by tracing Locke's interest in the Cartesian theory of vortices. While Locke's initial attitude (circa 1678) seems to have been one of "tentative acquiescence" (38), by the publication of his review of Newton's Principia in 1688, he had become convinced that Newton had decisively refuted "Descartes's speculative vortex theory" (45). Even so, Locke "maintained an interest in Cartesian-style and Cartesian-inspired cosmogonical writings in both English and French well into the 1690s" (45). He even recommends some of these writings in Some Thoughts Concerning Education -- although, significantly, he recommends them only "as that which is most in Fashion" because "It is necessary for a Gentleman in this learned Age to look into some of them, to fit himself for Conversation" (quoted on 46). Anstey suggests that, throughout this period, Locke likely "continued to believe that a vortical explanation of planetary motions was plausible" (45), only coming to dismiss vortex theory "outright" around 1697 (46).

The third and fourth chapters, both of which examine Locke's philosophy of body, pair very well together: while their conclusions are mutually consistent, the former focuses on Locke's agreement with Descartes while the latter takes up a point of disagreement. In "The Cartesian Element in Locke's Anti-Cartesian Conception of Body", Hill argues that, whereas hardness for Locke is just a heightened tendency to resist division, solidity or impenetrability is a universal property of every part of matter in virtue of which no two parts of matter can occupy the same spatiotemporal region. Hill thus has Locke taking sides with Descartes against the Epicureans, who identify solidity with the indivisibility of atoms. According to Hill, this "Cartesian element" in Locke's conception of body underlies much of Locke's mature agnosticism about the essence of matter. Whereas Descartes held that the solidity or impenetrability of matter could explain its hardness or cohesion, Locke rejected as vacuous both Descartes's particular explanation as well as the various explanations proposed by some of Descartes's followers. According to Locke, we simply do not understand why matter coheres in the way that it does. This ignorance, Hill says, "confirmed [Locke's] view that a knowledge of the real essence of material things was quite beyond our powers" (61). Hill concludes that Locke's agnosticism about the essence of matter stems in large part from his appreciation of the explanatory failure of Cartesian physics, a significant portion of which he actually accepts.

Turning to the point of disagreement, in "Are Body and Extension the Same Thing? Locke versus Descartes (versus More)", Downing examines Locke's argument in Essay 2.13.11-14 against Descartes's identification of body and extension. In his correspondence with Henry More, Descartes argues that extension entails impenetrability (or solidity) because we cannot conceive of one part of extension interpenetrating another -- when we try to do so, we can only conceive of one part of extension running up against another and being annihilated. After an illuminating discussion of the argument, Downing finds it unpersuasive and then goes on to suggest that Locke correctly diagnoses its failure. According to Downing, when Locke complains that Descartes has conflated the idea of body with the idea of extension, he "specifically counters the claim from the correspondence with More that extension brings with it impenetrability or solidity" (72). Indeed, Downing suggests that Locke undermines the very foundation of Descartes's argument when he (Locke) claims that the parts of extension are inseparable and immobile: the reason why we cannot conceive of the parts of extension interpenetrating one another (as Descartes rightly claimed) is because we cannot conceive of one part of extension moving relative to another in the first place.

Bolton's "Modes and Composite Material Things According to Descartes and Locke" bridges the first half of the volume (which focuses on physics) and the second (which turns to other topics, metaphysics in particular) by focusing on the metaphysical constitution of material substances. Bolton argues for controversial readings of both Descartes and Locke. According to Bolton, both hold that most sensible things (horses, trees, and other macroscopic objects) are not substances but composite entities composed of substances and modes. As for Descartes, Bolton argues that Cartesian bodies are individuated by motions that carve up res extensa, thereby actualizing one of the indefinitely many possible ways of dividing extended substance into parts. The resulting bodies are not identical to parts of extended substance; instead, an individual body is composed of (1) a part of extended substance and (2) a motion that individuates that part. As for Locke, Bolton takes very seriously Locke's claim in Essay 2.27.2 that "We have the Ideas but of three sorts of Substances; 1. God. 2. Finite Intelligences. 3. Bodies", which she reads as reflecting an austere, mechanist ontology of material substances. For Bolton's Locke, the only material substances are atoms (and aggregates thereof). Ordinary sensible objects, therefore, are not substances but instead "[consist] of a number of insensible particles, each of which is a substance, and several entities which are not in the category substance, the primary qualities of the several particles and a shared texture" (95). One important consequence of Bolton's picture is that modes end up doing a lot of work both for Descartes and for Locke, individuating bodies at a time and over time. It must be said that Bolton's paper is likely to be the most challenging in the collection; it is both the longest and the most densely argued. To my mind, however, it may also be the most rewarding.

Leaving the realm of physics, Matthieu Haumesser argues in "Virtual Existence of Ideas and Real Existence: Locke's Anti-Cartesian Ontology" that Locke distinguishes two kinds of existence: the "real existence" of things (in particular, bodies) and the "virtual existence" of ideas. He takes this distinction to reflect "Locke's rejection of Descartes's ontology" (105). According to Haumesser, Locke is a dualist insofar as he holds that "there is always a gap between ideal existence (in the mind) and real existence", but (in contrast with Descartes) "This dualism does not consist in distinguishing two kinds of substances (material and spiritual), but two kinds of existence -- one of which (the existence of ideas in the mind) is clearly and deliberately deprived of any substantiality" (113). One question I was left with is why, on Haumesser's interpretation, Locke seems to treat "existence" univocally in Essay 2.7.7, where he writes that one and the same idea of existence is "suggested to the Understanding, by every Object without, and every Idea within."

In "Locke and Descartes on Selves and Thinking Substances", Hamou argues provocatively -- yet compellingly -- that, in his discussion of the self in Essay 2.27, "Locke was here perhaps closer to the true spirit of Cartesian philosophy than he ever was" (120). Of course, Locke denies Descartes's claim that the consciousness that we have of ourselves in thinking is sufficient to disclose the nature of thinking substance. Locke thus distinguishes "the knowledge we have of our selves through conscious experience, and the knowledge that there is a thinking substance in us which thinks" (128). For this reason, Locke is sceptical of the Cartesian claim that the soul thinks essentially, arguing instead that it is more "probable, that thinking is the Action and not the Essence of the soul" (quoted on 132). While Locke disagrees with Descartes about thinking substance, however, Hamou argues that Locke's subsequent account of the self is profoundly Cartesian. Having denied that it is the essence of the soul to think, Locke goes on to make consciousness constitutive of the self, effectively conceding the Cartesian point that conscious thought is the essence of the self if not of thinking substance.

In "Locke and Descartes on Free Will: The Limits of an Antinomy", Denis Kambouchner argues that, despite some superficial differences, Locke and Descartes share essentially the same approach to questions of free will. For both figures, Kambouchner claims, free will stems fundamentally from the deliberative process by which we determine our actions, and therefore is manifested most plainly in cases in which "the mind veers back and forth among several different sides or reasons . . . and is led to reflect on its own determination" (156). More importantly, however, Kambouchner argues that "what unites Descartes and Locke can be said here to be an extremely acute awareness . . . of the extreme complexity of the question (of the conditions under which our volitions are determined)" (155-156), or their shared appreciation that "it is impossible to unravel the whole process of deliberation, to obtain a clear view of how our thoughts determine one another and the time-frame within which they do so" (156). This point strikes me as being importantly correct with regard to Locke and may help to explain why Locke introduces the power of suspension in Essay 2.21.47 as an empirical datum, writing simply that it "is evident in Experience" that we possess "a power to suspend" our desires.

Wilson argues in "Essential Religiosity in Descartes and Locke" that, despite some obvious points of disagreement, Locke and Descartes share an "essential religiosity" that comes out most clearly in their "notions of forgiveness and non-judgementalism" (169). On the one hand, despite the promise of a demonstrative morality, Locke recognizes human moral mediocrity and reassures us that God will deal mercifully and generously with our moral failings (165-166). On the other hand, Wilson argues for what she calls a kind of "Cartesian humility" (167): while the Cartesian God is utterly implacable, the object neither of veneration nor of fear (both of which imply the possibility of favour) but simply of resigned love (167-168), Wilson takes this very "attitude of acceptance towards all that befalls us [to follow from Descartes's] conception of the universe as a law-governed realm, manifesting God's impersonal wisdom and power" (169).

In "Locke and Port-Royal on Affirmation, Negation, and Other Postures of the Mind", Laurent Jaffro argues that, for Locke, the verbal signs of affirmation and negation can signify different acts of the mind, specifically, both predication and assertion. This "two-act thesis" (173) is not unique to Jaffro, who acknowledges his debt to Walter Ott. Instead, Jaffro's innovation is to situate the two-act thesis in the context of Locke's views about syncategorematic terms (or "particles"), which Locke takes to signify not ideas but acts of the mind. Because Locke indicates that there are far more such acts than there are syncategoremata, Jaffro argues that Locke likely takes the terms of affirmation and negation to be equivocal, signifying sometimes predication and sometimes assertion. Indeed, Jaffro even goes so far as to claim that Locke takes this equivocity to be a virtue:

Whilst, to be understood without confusion, the equivocity of categorematic terms should be avoided as much as possible, the equivocity of syncategorematic terms, on the other hand, is actually recommended and even necessary in order to understand the various ways in which we consider a proposition or a group of propositions. (180)

Andreas Blank argues in "Cartesian Logic and Locke's Critique of Maxims" that Locke's critique of maxims (such as "the whole is greater than the part" or "it is impossible for something to be and not to be") is argumentatively similar to criticisms found in the work of 17th-century Cartesian logicians such as Johannes Clauberg and the Port-Royalists. These Cartesian logicians often directed their arguments not only against scholastic Aristotelians (against whom Locke directs his criticism) but also against a competing, Ramist account on which maxims play no role in pre-reflective reasoning but rather make explicit the rules that implicitly structure our pre-reflective reasoning (196-200). According to Blank, the Cartesians had no good objection to the Ramist account, and neither did Locke. Blank admits that "Locke does not address the Ramist tradition in any explicit way" (201), but suggests that this very neglect is instructive. Even supposing that Locke's criticism of scholastic Aristotelianism is successful, he has nonetheless overlooked another philosophically-significant function of maxims.

Finally, in "Locke and Malebranche: Intelligibility and Empiricism", Nicholas Jolley examines Locke's complaint that Malebranche's doctrine of vision in God is "unintelligible" and asks whether this criticism "[does] not tell equally against Locke's own empiricist theory" (205). According to Jolley, Locke charges Malebranche with speaking unintelligibly by using phrases that are either absurd or meaningless. Locke himself admits, however, that the mechanism by which ideas are caused in us by external objects, if not strictly unintelligible, is at least "incomprehensible" or "inconceivable" (214-215). On this point, Jolley suggests that Malebranche has the upper hand, since Malebranche's doctrine of vision in God "postulates nothing incomprehensible about our perception of the physical world" (215). Of course, Locke might respond that unintelligibility is a much more serious defect than incomprehensibility -- it is one thing to admit that some features of the world cannot be understood; it is quite another to talk nonsense. Jolley argues, however, that Locke's admission of incomprehensibility at least undercuts his own positive argument for the empiricist theory of ideas, since Locke must concede that "it is possible, for all we know, that there are other ways in which we might come to possess ideas" (216).