Locke, Hume, and the Treacherous Logos of Atomism: The Eclipse of Democratic Values in the Early Modern Period

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Robert J. Roecklein, Locke, Hume, and the Treacherous Logos of Atomism: The Eclipse of Democratic Values in the Early Modern Period, Lexington, 2015, 247pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498509817.

Reviewed by Stefanie Rocknak, Hartwick College


In this ambitious, far-reaching book, Robert Roecklein argues that the philosophical notion of "atomism" has had, and continues to have, a rather crippling effect on philosophy and politics. In particular, Roecklein claims, "atomism" is a metaphysical theory, that, generally speaking, maintains that the ultimate, smallest bits of the universe are not perceivable. Moreover, these bits constitute "indestructible and eternal 'being.'" (xiii) As a result, according to the atomist, "ordinary" experience, particularly, "ordinary" perception -- where we appear to apprehend objects, e.g. tables and chairs -- does not, in fact, access "being." Concomitantly, the "ordinary" person is effectively disenfranchised from most political discussions because, Roecklein claims, political philosophers must have access to being: "Atomism is metaphysics. It leads us back into the domain of 'being.' The domain of 'being' of course is the domain of what exists. Political philosophers above all need to begin with what exists, because political philosophy in truth must begin as opinion" (33)

And thus, Roecklein takes on two central projects in this book: to show that although atomism is an ancient theory, its presence has been largely overlooked, and to show that atomism plays a crucial role in the "indictment of sense perception," (x) where this indictment is "political." (x) To do this, he divides his book into five chapters, which are bookended with a fairly lengthy Preface, Introduction and Epilogue. The first chapter focuses on contemporary approaches to perception and epistemology, while the remaining four discuss Locke and Hume.

In the Preface, Roecklein addresses what he takes to be our collective prejudices regarding ordinary opinion; "[according to this prejudice] ordinary opinions are not really evidence of truth, and . . . scholarship must overcome them." (ix) In the course of explaining this prejudice, he claims that Locke and Hume are to blame for obscuring the history of atomist philosophy. In particular, in virtue of claiming to be "empiricists," Locke and Hume appear to celebrate ordinary perception. However, Roecklein promises to show that neither Locke nor Hume are actual empiricists, but instead, are atomist philosophers, and so, endorse the atomist metaphysical (i.e. not empirical) position; "It has been injurious to philosophy, and certainly to political philosophy, to have labored under the impression that Locke is a sincere expositor of the doctrine that perceptual experience is the origin of our ideas." (xiii). In the Preface, Roecklein also promises to refute atomism with an appeal to Plato, writing: "Opinions for Plato are in between being and not-being; which is to say that they get some of the truth. The atomist philosophies have much less respect for ordinary opinion than Plato does." (xviii)

In the Introduction, Roecklein presents a broad historical overview of atomistic philosophy, including a discussion of Leucippus, Democritus, Parmenides, Zeno, particle physicists, Einstein, Bacon, Hobbes, Machiavelli, Descartes, Spinoza, Epicurus, Lucretius and Wittgenstein. All of these scientists/philosophers are, he claims, atomists in the respect that the "essence of the atomist teaching is that there is a body that is eternal. A more technical way of saying this is that the atoms do not have 'parts.'" (2) As such, Roecklein continues, "people simply are not acquainted with what the real bodies in nature are." (3). To present a counterargument to these philosophers/scientists, he discusses Plato's Parmenides. More specifically, he argues that Plato's dismissal of Parmenides' notion of unity can be applied to the notion of an indivisible "atom." For, Roecklein argues, Parmenides' unity must, if it is to exist, admit of "being" as a part, and so, it follows that it must admit of parts in general. The same applies to anything that is alleged to be indivisible, e.g. an "atom." That is, if it is to exist, an "atom" cannot be indivisible because it must have at least one part, i.e. being. Roecklein writes: "We have arrived, in truth, at the core analysis of Parmenides' philosophy, but also of the atomistic philosophy. The atoms, as Leucippus and Democritus define them, are also indivisible. They too would be regarded as perfect nuggets of 'being' if these theorists had their preference." He immediately continues: "Yet the atoms are said to be indivisible: they are unities. Therefore, the same logic that Plato employed to refute Parmenides' argument, can be employed to refute the atomist argument." (13)

Roecklein claims that as a result, Plato "vindicates" (14) ordinary perception. This is the case because: "Once the reality of the perishable and perceivable bodies is proved, the authority of perception to know these bodies is restored." (14). In fact, Roecklein continues: "In another dialogue, the Theaetetus, Plato examines perceptual judgement itself with great care. In the Theaetetus, Plato fends off arguments from Protagoras and Heraclitus, both of whom seek to indict the authority of perceptual judgement to know truths about common objects." (14)

Having established his central argument against atomism qua Plato, Roecklein turns to Chapter One, "The Philosophies of Perception and Epistemology Today." Here, Roecklein's scope is, once again, rather ambitious; he addresses the work of, at least: Descartes, Jaegwon Kim, W.V.O. Quine, John Dewey, Donald Davidson, John Searle, John Campbell, Bill Brewer, Frank Jackson, Paul Churchland, Plato, Functionalism, David Lewis, Barry Stroud, and Saul Kripke. In brief, Roecklein's claim is that the physicalism embraced, or inadvertently endorsed, by most of the philosophers/positions just mentioned is the contemporary manifestation of atomism. As such, the contemporary philosophical scene has, in effect, crippled philosophy, if not the humanities in general, from both a political and epistemological point of view. This is the case, because, as noted above, atomism, qua physicalism, shuts the ordinary person off from access to reality, and so, ordinary opinions are effectively undermined. Roecklein writes: "The larger project of philosophy in recent times has involved reducing the mental to the physical." He immediately continues: "In other words, when people articulate opinions about social and political situations, philosophy would like to interpret this as essentially due to conditions of the brain and nervous system . . . The physical in this case, ultimately, refers to atoms." (34) Approximately midway through the chapter, Roecklein once again invokes ancient philosophy as the countervailing voice to the physicalists/contemporary atomists. In particular, he writes:

In Plato's point of view . . . awareness is not "material," it is not "physical," and it is not beholden to the senses. Rather the mind employs the senses. Aristotle unfolds the same model of perception in his De Anima. There is a conscious mind which coordinates the sensory information. Pattern is both in the sensed objects and in the intelligent soul. Objects in the world happen to be formed objects (64)

Chapter Two, "John Locke's Philosophy of Mind" explains why, in detail, Locke is an atomist. In particular, Roecklein argues that not only is Locke's "experimental," i.e. empirical philosophy, inherently atomist, it is, concomitantly, elitist; it subjugates common perception. For instance, Roecklein writes: "in Locke's model, the ordinary speakers are deemed incompetent to know for themselves what are the humblest truths of perception, knowledge that experience had never taught them to doubt." (87) He continues further on:

Nobody, not even philosophers outside their office hours, describe perceptible objects as bundles of qualities . . . Locke's reduction of objects to bundles of qualities is close enough to the atomist portrait of the macroscopic object as a mere arrangement of particles. (93)

In Chapter Three, "Locke on Consent, Morals and Education," Roecklein discusses the moral and political ramifications of Locke's atomism. He writes: "For the purposes of political philosophy, doctrines of perception are of absolute importance. For that determines, a priori, the status that will be accorded to ordinary opinions." (121) However, Locke's atomism, as noted above, effectively precludes all but philosophers from reaching the "truth." As such:

in the Essay, the individual who lacks deep philosophical training, who believes that he perceives the actual apple directly, is far from 'equal to the greatest.' He is so far from being equal to the greatest, that his capacities for truth are likened to those of the lower animals over whom such men and women are accustomed to govern. (127)

The remaining two chapters of the book concern Hume. In Chapter 4, "Hume on the Limits of Thought," Roecklein addresses Hume's commitment to atomism. he writes: "it is not all rational mentality, which is indicted under Hume's theory, just the sensory perception of the generality of the human race." (155) He immediately continues: "It is the non-philosophers who are being reduced to mere standards of mere impulse and body. Ordinary mentality is being subjected to a severe dressing down, and there is nothing in this indictment that fails to be political in implication." (155) Ultimately, Roecklein concludes that according to Hume's theory of impressions, our access to the world is limited to "certain atomic sensations" (167), and so, we must imagine objects.

The final chapter, "Hume's Moral Philosophy," examines the political and moral implications of Hume's atomism. More specifically, Roecklein paints a picture where the Humean individual is, by and large, self-serving: "the calling into question our ability to know is converted into a launching pad for self-aggrandizing impulses which are blind to any common set of facts." (191) Particularly lacking in the moral governance of the self is reason, and thus, the Humean moral agent is effectively rudderless. To support his critique, Roecklein appeals to Aristotle, and in particular, the Nicomachean Ethics (193).

In the Epilogue, Roecklein argues that Leo Strauss is also a proponent of atomist philosophy, and thus, like the multitude of other philosophers and scientists Roecklein admonishes in this book, Strauss undermines the ordinary human being's ability to perceive and to effectively engage in politics.

I sympathize with Roecklein's claim that in principle, atomistic philosophy compromises our perception of what we take to be "ordinary" objects (e.g. cats, cars, etc.). For if these things are not truly representative of what exists, then the ordinary perceiver does not, in fact, have access to reality. I also agree with his controversial claim that Hume thought that we must (unwittingly) imagine objects (see Rocknak 2013).

However, I don't think that Roecklein presents as convincing a case as he could, either in regard to atomism in general, or in regard to his position on Hume. First, although I appreciate "big picture" approaches, I think the book is too ambitious and far-reaching; by my count, he rebukes at least 30 atomistic philosophers/scientists. As a result, his critique of atomism tends to be too general and, for the most part, Roecklein does not take enough of the relevant secondary literature into account. Second, although the book is well-written, its structure reflects its over-ambitious scope; too much is covered too quickly in the Preface, the Introduction and Epilogue. The material in these sections should have been either omitted altogether (e.g. the Epilogue on Strauss) or parsed into separate chapters. Chapter 1, "The Philosophies of Perception and Epistemology Today," also covers too much ground too quickly; indeed, this chapter could be a book onto itself.

It would also have been helpful if Roecklein had devoted much more time to Plato and Aristotle. This is especially the case with Plato; most scholars would argue that he was not a champion of ordinary perception, but rather, espoused the virtues of pure rationality. Moreover, because Roecklein relies so heavily on his interpretation of Plato's refutation of atomism in the Parmenides, I would have like to have seen him discuss this argument in much more depth than he does. In particular, can we really refute all of the philosophers/scientists (including Locke and Hume) that Roecklein addresses because being, i.e. existence, must be a part of an atom, therefore, atoms must have parts, and so, are really not indivisible, and so, it seems, are not the indestructible, ultimate parts of the universe that the atomists claim they are? Much more needs to be said about this before we can dismiss atomism -- and all of its proponents -- in the manner that Roecklein does.

In regard to Hume, I think that Roecklein should have presented much more textual evidence to make his case (although, as noted above, I happen to agree with him). The same applies to his analysis of Locke. For as noted above, although I appreciate the "big picture", sometimes it cannot be effectively presented without paying careful attention to the details. I wish that Roecklein had done more of the latter throughout his book.


Rocknak, S. Imagined Causes: Hume's Conception of Objects, Dordrecht: Springer, 2013.