Locke, Language and Early-Modern Philosophy

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Hannah Dawson, Locke, Language and Early-Modern Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 361pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521852714.

Reviewed by Walter Ott, Virginia Tech


Hannah Dawson's book, the latest in Cambridge University Press's 'Ideas in Context' series, is a valuable contribution to the history of ideas.  More than half of the book is devoted to the background and context of early modern thinking about language, with a final third or more focusing on Locke.  Marshalling an impressive array of sources, some of which are only available in manuscript form, Dawson provides an important resource for those interested not just in Locke's thought but in the intellectual climate generally.  Though there is much useful material here, I do have some reservations.

The book's "distinctive thrust" is that "the early modern preoccupation with language originates from deep fears about the corruptible nature of words themselves" (p.5).  The moderns reject the Aristotelian 'linguistic-ontological paradigm,' which has it that language is, more or less, a good guide to metaphysics.  (One surprising omission in Dawson's otherwise exhaustive account is any discussion of Galileo, who, like Bacon, warns of taking the existence of a noun or adjective as evidence for a corresponding thing or quality.)  Modern queasiness about language also arises from an increasing awareness of the dangers of ambiguity, and hence the possibility two speakers might not, despite appearances, share a common language.  Finally, she thinks, the moderns are worried that words bewitch us and take the place that should be occupied by ideas or things.

Dawson's book falls into three roughly equal parts.  Part I (chapters 1-3) devotes a chapter each to the members of the scholastic trivium -- logic, grammar, rhetoric -- which formed the basis of education in the period.  Part II (chapters 4-6) focuses on the moderns' reactions to the competing strains of thought that Dawson sees in previous philosophies of language.  Part III (chapters 7-10) turns to Locke and uses his views of language to illuminate his moral and political thought.  Ultimately, she finds a contradiction between Locke's claims that we share, or can share, a common language and his "grisly inkling of semantic instability" (p.211).

In Part I, Dawson discusses the emphasis on formal disputation in standard works of logic, as well as the logicians' appeal to authority, both of which so exasperated the moderns.  Dawson suggests that it was not only the Terminists who thought that words could signify things but also most logicians generally, who tended in practice (often despite their own pronouncements) to conflate ideas and things under the heading of 'res.'  Grammarians, for their part, tended to think in two opposing directions.  The first emphasizes, as many of the logicians did, the seamless connection between word, idea, and world, while the second reveals language as a contingent tissue of purely conventional practices.  Especially important for Dawson is the growing awareness of ambiguity, or what she calls 'semantic instability,' which she takes to undermine the notion that language mirrors, or can mirror, the world.  This second tendency is further amplified in rhetoric, whose devices show that language can be a powerful persuasive tool rather than a reflection of the world as it truly is.  The opposition between these two tendencies is fundamental to the entire book and the thinkers she discusses are divided by which one they exemplify (though most, it turns out, exemplify both to differing degrees).

Although this is an interesting analysis, there are several areas of concern that demand attention.  My first worry is whether Dawson has done enough to show that the two tendencies are indeed irreconcilable, or even prima facie in conflict.  As she points out, nearly every party to the debate holds that, at least post-Babel, words get their meaning by convention, onomatopoeia aside.  What Dawson calls 'semantic universality' -- the view that, by our nature, all humans share or can share a language of thought (see p.129) -- is not threatened by an awareness of the contingent status of natural languages.  That any natural language will exhibit ambiguity and that distinct languages have different grammatical rules are neither in tension with semantic universality nor, one would think, particularly surprising.  Dawson is thus led to make much out of little.  For example, the Port-Royalian claim that "every language is full of countless similar words that share only the same sound, but are nevertheless signs of completely different ideas" is said to be a "radical and devastating rejection of the twin traditional beliefs in univocal languages and an eternal community of meaning" (p.39).  But the Port-Royalians' quotidian observation cannot justify this grand pronouncement.

Throughout, Dawson operates with an unduly restrictive notion of translatability that leads her to make hyperbolic claims.  She takes the grammarians to have shown (though she claims they did not develop the point) that languages with different grammars are not mutually translatable (p.63); thus Latin, which lacks anything corresponding to French articles, is said to be "incommensurable" with French (p.63).  She attributes the same view to Locke (p.227).  But translation does not require a one-to-one correspondence between syntactic elements.  In fact, there is no evidence that Locke denied the mutual translatability or 'commensurability' of languages with different grammars; all he does in the text she cites (Essay II.xxiii.6) is point out that there are, in every language, "many particular words, which cannot be rendered by any one single word of another" (emphasis mine).[1]

Despite the opposition Dawson sees between the two tendencies (semantic universality and an awareness of the contingent status of natural languages) throughout the pre-modern periods, Dawson thinks the dominant view was the first: the world, as opposed to conventional use, is the source of linguistic structure (p.112).  In Part II, she explores philosophers' developments of these two strains, in the work of such figures as Sextus, Gassendi, Pufendorf, Bacon, Hobbes, and Descartes.  Here she connects, more explicitly than in Part I, the first tendency with Aristotelian thinking about substance and essence.  Aristotle's form-based view of intentionality is said to allow language to "gorge on [an] intimate union between mind and world" (pp.93-4).  There is much interesting material here, though I find some of her analyses less than coherent.

As a case in point, consider Dawson's account of Descartes (p.107f.).  Dawson provides a quick tour of Descartes's epistemology and metaphysics.  The purposes of this review are [1] "to counter the widespread assumption … [1a] that the Cartesians considered language solely as the expression of thought, and [1b] that this constituted a rival theory of language" (p.110),[2] as well as [2] to show that the Cartesians' language "is ambitious, embracing the whole world and penetrating its essence" (p.111).

It is difficult to see how the claims embodied in (1) can be consistent.  Consider (1b): one reading has it that, for Descartes and his followers, language is solely the expression of thought.  So far from being a rival view, Dawson argues, it is in line with a long tradition of logical works.  But this then conflicts with her denial of (1a): if Descartes et al. do not in fact consider language solely as the expression of thought, then they cannot be in lock-step with the logicians who did.

In the same passage, Dawson argues that Descartes and his followers "do tend to collapse 'things' into 'ideas'" (p.111).  To justify this, she cites Descartes's claim that words have no resemblance to the things they signify.[3]  But the passage she quotes leaves open whether these 'things' are indeed things in the weighty sense or merely mental contents.  That Descartes is ambiguous here is not a reflection of some incipient idealism but of his purpose in that paragraph of Le Monde, viz., to show that sign and signified need not resemble each other, and to clear the way for his own semiotic account of perception.  Disappointingly, all that remains of Dawson's claim (2) that Descartes is committed to a "realist scope of words," with words "embracing the whole world and piercing its essence" (p.111), is that Descartes is committed to essentialism.

Dawson is on firmer ground in chapter 5, where she points to moral discourse as the locus of modern concerns about semantic instability, and in the following chapter, where she focuses on modern concerns about the power of words.  Given their sensible natures, many thinkers worry that they can overpower the understanding and take the place of ideas in mental discourse.  In line with Berkeley, who comes too late to be included in the book, they also worry about the persuasive and emotive uses of words.

All of this sets the background for Part III, in which Dawson moves on to Locke.  On her view, Locke mounts a "case against language" that "turns out to subvert, if not obviate, crucial ambitions of his philosophy" (pp.8-9).  Dawson reads Locke as concerned, not so much with how we succeed in communicating, but with how we fail.  This is certainly true, and other writers have emphasized that Locke's views have normative force: they represent an ideal we should aspire to, if we rarely achieve.  To say that Locke mounts a case against language that is "potentially devastating" and "threatens to dim the light of knowledge" (p.9) is over-stating matters.  Indeed, when we turn to chapter seven, the first to focus on Locke, we find Dawson emphasizing the continuity between Locke's thought and that of prior thinkers: "[w]hile Locke subscribes to the more traditional view that mental and verbal discourses might in theory run in perfect parallel, he fears that in practice they do not" (p.186).  So, far from mounting an 'assault' on language, Locke is concerned to point out the cases in which it is abused or misleads us.

Throughout the book, Dawson seems to me to exaggerate the skeptical side of Locke.  Dawson contends that Locke robs the traditional triumvirate word-idea-thing "of its last man" (p.185).  But this ignores Locke's semiotic epistemology, according to which ideas of sensation are reliable indicators of extra-mental states of affairs.  Similarly, Dawson claims that Lockean ideas "bear no resemblance to the world" (p.8).  But ideas of primary qualities, in addition to serving as indicators, also resemble their objects.  Oddly, Dawson goes on to point this out herself.  The tendency to state and retract positions is one of the more frustrating features of the book.  Often a view is presented -- that Locke severs language from the world, for example -- only to be retracted or modified in a more sober moment (see, e.g., p.182).

A key theme of Part III is the contradiction Dawson sees between Locke's awareness of semantic instability and his insistence, at both the normative and, to a lesser degree, descriptive levels, on a shared language.  Dawson takes Locke's awareness of the privacy of meanings to threaten the 'semantic contract' by which we (tacitly) agree to use words in the same way.  Her Locke is thus deeply self-contradictory.  On one hand, he thinks that language is "inherently and inadvertently equivocal" (p.218) and that it is nothing more than "an empty web of signifiers, hovering indeterminately, except as incarnated in the mouths of individual men" (p.219).  On the other, as Dawson fully illustrates, Locke assumes, both in his practice and explicitly, that communication is, of course, possible.

It emerges only later in the course of Dawson's book that Locke in fact prescribes a set of remedies for the abuse of words (III.xi).  Locke thinks there are clear, if tedious, steps we can take to ensure univocity.  Once again, it turns out that, while Locke is keenly aware of the dangers of miscommunication, he does not think language is "inherently" equivocal; it is equivocal when it is used by careless people, or by people with purposes that do not require special care.

Dawson's main contribution here, I think, is to emphasize a point previously made by Michael Ayers and others: Locke's account of abstraction and his resulting 'compositional nominalism' mean that concept-formation is an activity that is performed largely at will.  Where some Aristotelians had assumed that the intelligible species of a being lodges in the mind and waits for the agent intellect to abstract it, Locke thinks that it is up to us just how we are to carve up the world.

But neither this fact, nor Locke's claim that words interpose themselves "between the understanding and the Truth" (III.ix.21, quoted on p.275), seems to me to justify Dawson's claim that "Locke demolishes the foundations of early-modern linguistic theory" or that he "jeopardizes reference, communication, and truth" (p.275; again, this is qualified or withdrawn on the next page).

In the final two chapters of the book, Dawson applies her view of 'the divided Locke' to his natural, ethical, and political theories.  In the realm of natural philosophy, Dawson thinks that "at the contradictory heart of Locke's philosophy of language lies the theoretical limitation of words to ideas coupled with the practical appearance of limitless words" (p.281).  That is, the supposition that words reach out to the real natures of things is in tension with his claim that words signify only ideas in the mind of the speaker.  A natural response here is that Locke takes the supposition in question to be a mistake.  And Dawson agrees.  But she thinks that the practical force of language makes his repeated assertion of the limitations of words to ideas "sound strained" (p.280).  Throughout her treatment of Locke runs a willingness to find, rather than resolve, contradictions.

Thus in the realm of politics, Dawson claims that Locke's semantic individualism seems to make his vision of civil society "logically impossible" (p.290).  This requires further argument.  The fact that people use words differently to varying degrees certainly means that there will be plenty of opportunities for mistakes and confusion in civil society, but it is hard to see how what Dawson calls "the dark side" (p.284) of Locke's views on language could make such society impossible.  Now, Dawson does a good job of showing how words for moral ideas, which are mixed modes, are not so readily agreed upon as words for simple ideas.  But I cannot see how Locke's constructivist epistemology, even in the case of mixed modes, could "prevent communication" (p.295).

Despite these concerns, I should emphasize that Dawson's book is a well researched and copiously documented piece of intellectual history.

[1] Dawson may have inherited this from Hans Aarsleff, who used a similarly odd concept of translatability in discussing many of the same passages; see Aarsleff, "Leibniz on Locke on Language," in From Locke to Saussure (University of Minnesota Press, 1982), 42-83; 54.  Ian Hacking also points out that the absence of one-one translation does not amount to an absence of translation tout court; see his "Locke, Leibniz, Language, and Hans Aarsleff," Synthese 75, 2 (1988): 135-153; 152.

[2] I have inserted the bracketed letters and numbers here for ease of reference.

[3] Oeuvres de Descartes Ed. C. Adam and P. Tannery (Paris: J. Vrin, 1996), 11 vols., vol. 11, p.4: "vous sçavez bien que les paroles, n'ayant aucune resemblance avec les choses qu'elles signifient…"