Locke on Persons and Personal Identity

Locke On Persons And Personal Identity

Ruth Boeker, Locke on Persons and Personal Identity, Oxford University Press, 2021, 336pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198846758.

Reviewed by David Wörner, Massachusetts Institute of Technology


Ruth Boeker provides the most scholarly and sophisticated book-length study of Locke’s view of personal identity to date. She puts forward a reading of Locke’s account of personal identity and its relationship to his eschatological and moral beliefs, she defends this account against both well-known and lesser-known objections leveled by Locke’s peers, and she reconstructs how the account emerges from Locke’s thinking about the philosophical and religious problems pertinent among his intellectual predecessors. There is no question that its careful study of the literature, attention to detail, thorough argumentation, and broad view of intellectual context make it mandatory reading for anyone with a scholarly interest in Locke’s theory of personal identity.

After an introductory chapter, Boeker turns, in Chapters 2 and 3, to an interpretation of Locke’s conception of identity in general. She ascribes to him what she calls a “kind-dependent approach” to persistence, according to which persistence conditions vary depending on the kind of entity at issue. A person, a human being, and an immaterial substance, accordingly, may be subject to different persistence conditions. This is a standard reading. What is distinctive and original about Boeker’s approach, however, is that she maintains that Locke is agnostic about how the kind-dependence of diachronic identity is to be spelled out. The literature about Locke’s view of persistence has been dominated by a split between commentators such as Matthew Stuart (2013), who read the view as a relative identity account, and proponents of “coincidence readings,” including Vere Chappell (1989).[1] The main issue of contention is, roughly speaking, whether Locke allows for distinct material objects to occupy the same place at the same time. Boeker argues, however, that “it is likely that he would doubt that the metaphysical disputes among defenders of Relative Identity and coincidence views can be settled and are worthwhile having” (39). She concludes that Locke is best seen as remaining neutral on the issue.

There is a worry about such an agnostic reading. If persistence depends on kind-membership, there must be some account of how this dependence works—whether or not Locke would be prepared to endorse it or was at all aware of the philosophical issue. If we want to come to an assessment of Locke’s overall metaphysical picture, we must try to fill in the gaps. For instance, Dan Kaufman (2007) has argued that the coincidence view is incompatible with Locke’s view of kind-membership. This argument might prompt us (with Kaufman) to hold that Locke’s view is ultimately inconsistent, but it might also prompt us to look for alternative readings, such as one in terms of relative identity. In any case, we cannot avoid asking what view of persistence fits better with Locke’s other commitments. Boeker’s agnostic reading seems unhelpful for such an endeavor.

Moreover, we cannot easily avoid ascribing a commitment to a particular metaphysics of persistence to Locke if we want to understand other, seemingly less arcane nodes in his philosophical web of belief. In fact, in Chapter 4, Boeker’s own interpretation of Locke’s rationale for his consciousness-based view of personal identity illustrates this. On Boeker’s view, this rationale can be reconstructed in terms of the following argument (see p73):  Since sameness of consciousness is necessary for just accountability, it is necessary for being the same “subject of accountability.” Persons are subjects of accountability. Therefore, sameness of consciousness is necessary for being the same person. According to this argument, persons have the same persistence conditions as subjects of accountability because persons are subjects of accountability. This line of reasoning is unavailable, however, to a proponent of a relative identity reading. For one crucial claim of relative identity theorists is that something may be a member of two kinds with differing persistence conditions. Something may, say, be both an animal and a mass of matter even though the conditions for remaining the same animal are different from those for remaining the same mass of matter. Accordingly, on a relative identity view, an animal may remain the same animal and yet become a different mass of matter. Similarly, a relative identity theorist may consistently hold that a person could be a subject of accountability even though the person can remain the same person without remaining the same subject of accountability. Blocking this option would either require rejecting the relative identity view or arguing that being the same person requires being the same subject of accountability for reasons other than the fact that persons are subjects of accountability. In any case, there seems to be a gap in Boeker’s argument.

This worry, I should note, does not lessen the fact that Boeker does an admirably insightful and unprecedently precise job of disentangling the moral dimension of Locke’s view of personal identity. In particular, she argues convincingly in Chapter 7 that, in putting forward his account of personal identity, Locke aims to articulate a view of the resurrection and divine punishment that is consistent with both materialist and immaterialist conceptions of the resurrection. And she argues in detail in Chapters 8 and 9 that this eschatological aim and metaphysical agnosticism provide Locke—and his philosophical ally Catharine Trotter Cockburn—with powerful tools to answer various criticisms advanced by intellectual contemporaries and successors, including, among others, G. W. Leibniz, David Hume, and Anthony Ashley Cooper, 3rd Earl of Shaftesbury. These discussions provide illuminating resources for any future attempt at understanding the place Locke’s view of personal identity takes within the wider debate among early modern authors.

The heart of Boeker’s book is her discussion and defense of Locke’s criterion of personal identity in Chapters 5, 6, and 8. As in other places, what she offers in these chapters is not so much a radically novel perspective, but an attempt at synthesizing various different interpretations. A crucial scholarly question concerns Locke’s notion of same consciousness: for Locke, a person remains the same person if and only if she retains the same consciousness: but what does this mean? Combining different proposals from the literature, Boeker in Chapter 5 proposes a “multiple aspects account of same consciousness,” according to which various features—memory, appropriation, as well as a feeling of unity and temporal ordering—are involved in the constitution of sameness of consciousness. And these are just the aspect of same consciousness of which a person is aware. In addition, there are causal relations underlying these aspects. With regard to memory, for example, there is an “ontological foundation that connects the initial experience with the later remembrance of it” (141), and similarly so for the other aspects. In effect it is ultimately these underlying relations that determine personal identity on Boeker’s reading, and she appeals to this thesis to resolve notorious problems about insufficiency and transitivity failure. If having the same consciousness were a mere subjective matter—a matter of what the person now feels, believes she remembers, or appropriates—it would seem that the mere fact that a person A has the same consciousness as a person B cannot be sufficient for A to be the same person as B. Actions and thoughts can, after all, be misremembered, and feelings and appropriations can be misplaced. Having the same consciousness therefore requires more than the presence of these subjective aspects: it requires the presence of the right underlying relations. To be sure, we cannot tell what these relations are. But this doesn’t jeopardize the solution. For what is relevant is God’s perspective, and “God will know whether thoughts and actions belong to a person, since he knows what the metaphysical foundation that connects them at a time and over time [is] and can trace it” (145). Boeker makes a similar move with regard to Locke’s view of the transitivity of personal identity. Again, if having the same consciousness were a merely subjective matter, it would seem that the relation of being the same person is not transitive—a consequence some readers of Locke’s theory have condemned and some applauded. For Boeker, the underlying causal relations, however, are transitive. Since they are what ultimately determines personal identity, the transitivity of personal identity is preserved. As before, the reading Boeker ends up with is not in itself particularly innovative. At its core, it is very close to Shelley Weinberg’s (2016, Ch. 4) objectivist reading: all that separates Boeker’s approach from Weinberg’s are, as Boeker puts it, “reservations about some metaphysical details” (145). Still, the details are important, and the strength of Boeker’s contribution is precisely its careful attention to the inner workings of Locke’s view.

Throughout the book, and particularly in Chapter 9, Boeker is very clear—and I think completely right—about an immensely important feature of the architecture of Locke’s view: his view of personal identity is designed to capture conditions of just accountability, and, in particular, conditions of accountability before God on the Day of Judgment. On the Last Day, a resurrected person is susceptible to divine punishment or reward for a given action if and only if she is the same person as whoever performed the action in this world. The point of Locke’s criterion of personal identity is to spell out this thesis. Suitability for this purpose, therefore, is a touchstone for any interpretation of Locke’s criterion of personal identity. Defenders of more subjectivist readings, such as Galen Strawson (2013, Ch. 7), often appeal to this as a reason to favor their approach: you are justly accountable for a given action, Locke appears to believe, only if you can “appropriate” the action, and conceive of it as an action you have done and are responsible for. Whether or not you are connected to the action by any underlying relations that are unknown to you, proponents of subjectivist views argue, is irrelevant. Against such charges, Boeker makes a move that echoes Shelley Weinberg’s (2016, Ch. 4) defense of an objectivist reading. What matters for Locke is that a resurrected person on the Day of Judgment can appropriate all the actions she is accountable for. And God can make sure that a person appropriates just those actions to which she is connected by the relevant underlying relations: “by tracing the underlying metaphysical foundation of same consciousness,” Boeker writes, God can “actively participate at the last judgment and make a resurrected person aware of past experience that would otherwise be neglected due to forgetfulness” (194). Rather than undermine the objectivist reading, Boeker argues, this substantiates them: only on objectivist readings is there an objective standard that determines which persons—persons accountable for which actions—God resurrects for the last judgment (see pp182–8).

Still, there are some worries about objectivist readings that Boeker does not discuss. One concerns the possibility of repentance, the role of which in Locke’s thinking, Boeker rightly observes, has not drawn very much scholarly attention. Suppose that a resurrected person is made aware of a sinful action she had forgotten about for most of her earthly life, say, for her last 60 years. Unable to recall the action, the person was, accordingly, unable to repent for the action. To be sure, she may regret the action once God makes her aware of it on Judgment Day. But at that point, there is no occasion for repentance—as Locke emphasizes, “Repentance does not consist in one single Act of sorrow [. . .] But in doing works meet for Repentance [. . .] the remainder of our Lives” (Locke 1999, 112). Moreover, since Locke believes that, without repentance, even a small sin suffices for damnation (see Locke 1999, 12–13), the person would seem to miss out on her chance for salvation, simply because she forgot about one—possibly minor—sin. It seems at least questionable that such a result would be acceptable to Locke.

The example also helps illustrate a more general worry about Boeker’s objectivist reading. Why should a resurrected person be accountable for an action she was unaware of for most of her life on earth? Boeker may say that she is accountable for the action because she can remember and appropriate it now, given that God makes her aware of all her actions on the Last Day. However, this awareness is not what makes the person accountable for the action. What makes her accountable, on Boeker’s reading, is the fact that she bears certain underlying relations to the action, relations God can trace even if they are inaccessible to the person herself. And even though God may on the Last Day make the person aware of the action in question, what makes her accountable for the action—the underlying relations—may still be inaccessible to her. This, however, invites the further question as to why it is precisely these relations that make a person accountable for an action. The answer Boeker seems to suggest is that these relations are the ones that underlie, and provide metaphysical foundations for, the aspects of sameness of consciousness of which persons are aware, such as memory and appropriation. But this doesn’t explain the normative significance of the underlying relations. In particular, it doesn’t account for why that significance is carried by the underlying relations rather than by the conscious aspects. Why does God care so much about certain unknown connections between persons and actions? It seems easier, by contrast, to account for the normative significance of memory and appropriation: remembering and appropriating an action is what allows a person to take a stance on the action, to regret it, repent for it, and to adjust her future conduct in light of it.

This consideration is of course far from a death blow for Boeker’s reading, but it indicates that some questions about the moral dimension of Locke’s criterion remain to be answered. And let me emphasize again that my reservations about some of Boeker’s arguments are minor in comparison to what I find valuable and insightful in this book.


Chappell, Vere. “Locke and Relative Identity.” History of Philosophy Quarterly 6 (1989): 69–83.

Kaufman, Dan. “Locke on Individuation and the Corpuscular Basis of Kinds.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 75 (2007): 499–534.

Locke, John. The Reasonableness of Christianity. Edited by John Higgins-Biddle. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999.

Reid, Thomas. Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man. Edited by Knued Haakonssen and James A. Harris. Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 2002.

Strawson, Galen. Locke on Personal Identity: Consciousness and Concernment. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2011.

Stuart, Matthew. Locke’s Metaphysics. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2013.

Weinberg, Shelley. Consciousness in Locke. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2016.

Wörner, David. Im Namen der Dinge. John Locke und der Begriff des Wesens. Basel: Schwabe, 2019.


[1] For full disclosure I should point out that I have defended a relative identity reading in Wörner 2019.