Locke on Toleration

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Richard Vernon (ed.), Locke on Toleration, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 177pp., $19.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521139694.

Reviewed by Ingrid Creppell, George Washington University


This slim volume in the Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy series brings together Locke's mature writings on toleration. It includes a new translation of his original famous Letter Concerning Toleration (written in Latin in 1685, published in London in 1689), as well as the exchange between Locke and Jonas Proast generated by the publication of the first Letter. Proast, Chaplain of All Souls, Oxford, wrote three replies and Locke a Second, Third and Fourth Letter in response to Proast during the course of their debate. Proast's first response is printed in full followed by excerpts from the subsequent works of each author. In addition, the editor, Richard Vernon, underscores the primary themes of their debate by adding a brief passage both from Locke's Second Treatise and from his Essay Concerning Human Understanding, on the extent of governmental power and the (in)voluntariness of human knowledge, respectively.

Over the past fifteen years, the secondary literature on Locke and toleration has grown enormously. Identity politics in western societies, the collapse of communism, and the resurgence of religious fundamentalism around the world led scholars and the public to focus on sources available for managing, if not solving, deep conflicts. A new interest in the origins of liberalism and toleration specifically has been the result. This text should become a primary resource for these studies. Its virtue for contemporary students and a broad audience resides not only in the modern translation of the famous Letter, but also in what it reveals, through the mouthpiece of Jonas Proast, about the worldview against which Locke's ideas had to do battle.

Michael Silverthorne translates Locke's ideas in succinct modern prose to bring out the vigorous, terse and yet passionate rhetoric. The text is divided into eight main sections, which underscores the seminal early formulation of the discourse of liberalism -- the nature and limits of political power and the separation between church and state. But importantly, this translation accentuates more clearly Locke's defense of a liberal ethos or civic culture accompanying the changed foundation of public power. Toleration then appears not solely as the cessation of the use of force by the ruler to compel conformity from minority religious groups, but as the capacity of persons (occupying various roles) in a society so established to extend peace, friendship and equal treatment toward those who do not share religious worship and doctrine. The largest of the sections addresses the "duties of mutual toleration" incumbent upon individuals, churches, clergymen, and rulers.

Tully once remarked that the Letter needs no interpretation, but inevitably it elicited a torrent of reaction and questioning, ever since its publication. The Letter's description of a church/state division (and accompanying cultural disposition) cannot prove the necessity of that revisioning. Thus, commentators continue to pose a variety of questions about the nature of Locke's argument(s) for toleration: How limited or powerful is the political domain when wielding tolerant policies? Does Locke offer a primarily pragmatic defense of this value? Is he more concerned with the irrationality of persecution than the rights of religious minorities? How does the social contract argument of the Second Treatise relate to the defense of a separation of church and state found in the Letter? Does Locke's toleration ultimately rest on skepticism toward religious truth?

These questions cannot be answered by examining Locke's first Letter Concerning Toleration in isolation. That text, composed in exile and under the shadow of Protestants fleeing France after Louis XIV's revocation of the Edict of Nantes in late 1685 (and Locke's own flight from England after the Rye House plot), gave an impassioned argument for the radical idea that all religious worship and beliefs ought to be allowed, so long as they do not undermine the authority of the national ruler. Such a call was bound to provoke alarm and denunciation, and would require hammering out through repeated and multi-layered defense. The inclusion of the Locke-Proast debate provides a crucial piece of the puzzle about how that was done.

On first reading that debate, one is struck by the telescoping of the issues because of Proast's singular focus on the utility of force. Locke's responses are repetitive and initially appear to get him nowhere in countering Proast's objection. The argument on which Proast fixates, and which Jeremy Waldron also spotlighted in a well-known article, can be stated as follows: authentic religious belief is necessary for salvation; such belief comes about when a person accepts the truth through his or her own mental illumination; that inner light cannot be forced. The particular instruments of politics are force; political means of coercion cannot bring about authentic belief but only external conformity. Therefore, rulers ought not attempt to accomplish something (saving belief) which they cannot in principle achieve. Proast got much mileage from the justifiable objection that a ruler's coercive force could bring a person to the brink of religious truth. Setting up situations in which a mind might (typically) be turned toward saving religious truths justified the ruler's use of coercion for this purpose. Moreover, as Proast repeatedly asserts, Locke begs the question in positing that the political government is established to attain "civil goods." What are those civil purposes and who decides that they must be restricted to life, liberty, physical integrity, freedom from pain, and external possessions?

What we see in the course of their polemic is Proast digging in to restate the devotional point of view and Locke expanding to deploy a variety of counter-arguments that put other kinds of imperatives on the table. That is, we perceive illustrated in their debate a head-to-head confrontation between devotional and secular modes of argumentation. This debate cannot be resolved through a coming to terms with whether force is useful or not; that is not the cause of contention, but a proxy for the real clash. The contention takes place at the level of basic worldviews: Proast believes that salvation should be the end-point of all human action, individual or political. All phenomena in the world are interpreted through that imperative. Noticeably, the editor chooses to conclude Proast's final excerpt with the following unbudging perspective:

any magistrate may believe his own false religion to be the true … [but] he is nevertheless at the same time most strictly forbidden by the first Table of the Divine Law to use (I say not force only, but) any means at all for the promoting his own religion: so that he will sin very heinously in doing it, though he does but act according to his judgement (p. 169).

After everything that has been said, Proast retreats from the minimal fa├žade of empirically based reasoning he had used, to indict rulers for the sin of promoting their own false religion. This could not be more alien from Locke's perspective.

Including the Locke-Proast debate in this volume enables the student to examine the history of toleration as a conceptual transformation in greater detail. Locke deploys different types of arguments and considerations to break the spell of the devotional point of view. He repeatedly stresses the negative consequences of generalizing a principle of religious coercion across the board; the practices of distant civilizations or other nations are brought in to enlarge the scale comparison. Most importantly, Locke always begins his counter-attacks with the question of the basis of the ruler's legitimacy. His famous question -- who is to judge? -- is put out there. Locke's line of questioning itself builds a point of view for a reasoning person interacting with others who have to deal with hard realities of conflict. Locke explicitly emphasizes that a variety of arguments are needed to construct a defense of toleration. No single logic will move people to accept that "every man has a right to toleration" -- a phrasing which finally appears in Locke's Third Letter. The seemingly tedious repetition then serves the purpose of building up the ballast for a secular mode of reasoning. We see how prudential arguments create the foundations for a revised moral outlook at the origins of the principle of toleration.

Richard Vernon has written an excellent introduction, which helps the reader identify the main set of arguments in the first Letter and through the evolution of the debate. It became incumbent upon Locke to explain how his defense of toleration did not imply skepticism toward religious truth. Vernon makes the distinction between political and epistemic skepticism, and shows how we can understand Locke to be concerned with the communicability of truth rather than doubting the existence of truth itself. Most importantly, Vernon provides a useful analysis of the link between Locke's toleration and social contract theory (in particular a crucial passage in the Third Letter encapsulating the core argument of the Second Treatise), and demonstrates the profound anti-paternalism of Locke's theory of state authority. Finally, Vernon persuasively argues that Locke's work on toleration demonstrates the autonomy of the domain of political theory as an essential human activity.

This volume will be essential to students of the history of toleration but also for those studying contemporary issues regarding prerequisites of a pluralist society, such as the nature of public reason and background political culture. It provides a close look into elements of the emergence of consequentialist and deontological arguments for liberal rights. More broadly, it also offers one of the most important examples of normative transformation at the grand rhetorical level and in the intricacies of conceptual combat.