Locke's Metaphysics

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Matthew Stuart, Locke's Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2013, 522pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199645114.

Reviewed by Benjamin Hill, University of Western Ontario


Locke's Metaphysics is a grand book. Matthew Stuart is a fantastic philosopher and wields his talents well in this book. You may not agree with his analyses, but if you are a reader of Locke's Essay, you will need to take Stuart's careful thinking very seriously. Of course this is not to say that the book is without limitations and disappointments, but the merits of the work as a whole outshine its lapses.

As the title indicates, the book is devoted to certain metaphysical themes in Locke. It is not a comprehensive survey of Locke's metaphysical thinking, for subjects like space and time, number, God, goodness, and cause and effect are missing. But all the major topics are there -- categories, qualities, secondary qualities, essence, substratum, mind and matter, identity, persons, and agency. Stuart moves from topic to topic without much concern for connections between them, as reflected in the description below.

Categories: Stuart sees Locke as a typical, Cartesian-style substance-mode ontologist, with the twist that events are thrown into the category of modes alongside properties. Modes are ontologically-dependent entities, which is to say that they depend on substances for their being, whereas substances are ontologically independent entities, even if they exhibit various causal dependencies. A particular difficulty with interpreting Locke, according to Stuart, is Locke's conflation of ideas and qualities or things, and Stuart goes to great lengths to sort through the confusion. In fact, appealing to this conflation helps Stuart to cut through many interpretative difficulties in the first half of the book.

Qualities: Stuart rejects the interpretation that all qualities are powers because it saddles Locke with a strong dispositionalism, an implausibly anthropocentric metaphysics of substances, and undermines his distinction between qualities in general and secondary qualities. He argues instead that Locke meant only that powers were among the qualities of bodies. Rounding out the chapter are discussions of individual primary qualities. Stuart denies that there is any connection between extension and cohesion, and he claims that Locke held co-location to be impossible and all bodies to be equally solid because the interstitial voids contained within any compressible substance are not parts of it. Stuart also, controversially, claims that Locke and Boyle attributed texture to individual corpuscles.

Secondary Qualities: Stuart struggles to interpret Locke's resemblance thesis, ultimately despairing and concluding that Locke was "in this case, hopelessly vague" and that "it [is] just as likely that he did not have any particular conception of resemblance in mind" (104). Much of Stuart's attention in the chapter is focused on resolving a tension in Locke's account of colors, a topic Stuart previously discussed in a paper in The Philosophical Review (2003). Stuart reads Locke as holding colors, and all other secondary and tertiary qualities of bodies, to be relational but non-dispositional features of bodies, but only when causing ideas in us.

Essence: Stuart's Locke is a very messy thinker regarding essences, for he was using both a nominal-essence-relative and a nominal-essence-independent conception of real essence, as well as being committed to both a bold rejection of natural kinds and the more modest claim that even if natural kinds exist, our taxonomic practices do not derive from or track those boundaries. While perhaps not confused, on Stuart's reading Locke's presentation of essences is certainly confusing. It is disappointing that Stuart does not engage Peter Anstey's argument that Locke was a species realist.[1] Stuart could have clarified his own interpretation by contrasting it with Anstey's notion of Locke's constrained and convergent conventionalism. And perhaps he would have been pushed to see greater clarity in Locke than his current reading suggests. Nor does he engage with Robert Pasnau's analysis of Essay III.6.4, which lies at the heart of his nominal analysis of Lockean real essences, preferring instead to explore the implausible doctrine of accidentalism.

Substratum: Stuart reads Locke as providing only a very thin and limited metaphysics of substance. He argues that all substantive interpretations of Locke's substratum are inadequate, and he is especially critical of the bare particular interpretation. He finds that Edwin McCann's "no theory" theory of substance is closest to the truth, even though it goes a bit too far in suggesting that Locke rejected all theorizing about substance. Stuart focuses on Locke's conceptions of obscurity and confusion to analyze his criticisms of the idea of substratum. He concludes that the heart of Locke's message is that we're all confused and muddled in our thinking about it, and I (Locke) can do nothing to straighten it out. So, while Locke does attempt to theorize about substance, his attempt fails to make any progress toward any theory about it. "Locke is in the unenviable position of being a philosopher who realizes that he is in a muddle, has some inkling of the sort of muddle he is in, without his being able to see his way through it entirely" (244).

Mind and Matter: Stuart sees Locke as a substance dualist primarily because of his commitment to God and angels. The notorious suggestion that God might make matter think indicates a commitment to a voluntarism that allows for powers not grounded in a thing's categorical features. This commitment, according to Stuart, also arises in Locke's conceptions of gravitational attraction and the powers of bodies to produce sensory ideas in us. This voluntarism, thus, precludes Locke from being a mechanist and explains his lukewarm attitude toward mechanism.

Identity: Stuart sees a primary problem for Locke concerning identity to be explaining how a substance is related to the mass that composes it. He critiques the four-dimensionalist and coincident-object interpretations of Locke -- the four-dimensional reading is not adequately rooted in the text, and the coincident-object reading is invalidated by Locke's rejection of the possibility of co-located bodies and his anti-essentialism. Stuart concludes that Locke must hold that identity is relative to how something is classified, making identity depend on the nominal essence relative real essence.

Persons: Stuart argues that Locke is a simple memory theorist rather than a memory continuity theorist. For Stuart's Locke, if you do not remember a past action despite trying to, you are not the same person as the one who performed it. Stuart's major contribution here is arguing that the simple memory theory can explain why Locke refused to tie the persistence condition of persons to their substantial natures even though they are substances. Locke's relativity about identity comes to the rescue here because it allows him to say that two persons are the same even though they are not the same substance. The key is that "substance" here is either a quasi-sortal or a dummy sortal, which means that Locke's identity conditions for substances are either very thin or supplied by the contrast with other sortals. In either case, the possibility for separating the identity conditions for persons from that for substances is preserved by the extreme thinness of the identity conditions for substances.

Agency: It is a good move to separate out the first edition account of agency from the second edition revision, as Stuart does. Stuart sees Locke as shifting between two conceptions of volition in the first edition, between volition as a wanting and volition as a striving, with the former being the inferior position. Stuart spends considerable energy on the problem of negative actions, willing not to do something. Locke holds a robust conception of negative actions, which means that not doings are possible objects of volition. But Stuart finds this to be problematic. Even though he defends Locke against Jonathan Lowe's charge that some actions may be voluntary and necessary, Stuart ultimately finds Locke's robust conception inadequate because it undercuts the requirement that one's willing is the cause of her not doing something.

Locke changes his account of agency considerably in the second edition of the Essay. These changes include the rejection of the idea that willing is wanting and that we are motivated by future greater goods. For Stuart, as for many interpreters, the most important revision was the addition of the claim that we can suspend the prosecution of our desires. But Stuart sees this as much less significant for Locke's view of agency than other interpreters have. He argues against interpreters who see this addition as a change to his account of freedom (Peter Schouls), a change in his account of motivation (Ezio Vailati, Tito Magri, John Yolton), or a rejection of his earlier claim that we cannot not will an action once it is proposed by the understanding (Vere Chappell). Stuart reads Locke as remarkably consistent in his revised account of agency and sees his later additions to it as clarifications rather than changes to his position.

One of the limitations of Stuart's book is that there is no overall sense of Locke as a metaphysical thinker. Stuart does well with close study of individual topics and sections of text, but he does nothing to tie the segments together or to establish a narrative thread pervading the whole work or to identify Locke's underlying orientation or motivations as a metaphysician.

Stuart is also disappointingly dismissive of contextualist analysis, which gives his book a different character than Pasnau's recent work on Locke. Moreover, Stuart's analyses would have benefited in several places from paying more attention to the historical context.[2] His attitude materially harms his account of Locke's relations. Locke holds a rather common, scholastic anti-realist understanding of relations.[3] His language includes many anti-realist stock phrases, including some analyzed independently by Stuart (e.g., that they are "extraneous, and superinduced"), and clearly echoes anti-realist presentations. An excellent resource for understanding the theory Locke's discussion points toward is Disputation I of Martin Smiglecki's Logica, "De ente rationis". By missing this background, Stuart misses how the ontology of relations was supposed to be connected to acts of comparison, and he is forced to conclude that Locke "is again being careless about the distinction between ideas and their objects" (30) when he is not.

Moreover, Stuart misses the real philosophical issue surrounding this anti-realist doctrine, namely the combination of a realist semantics for relations with their anti-realist metaphysics, which Locke's difficult account of archetypes was supposed to support. Another place where Stuart could benefit from a bit of contextualist analysis is his discussion of superaddition (266-280). Rather than looking toward the OED and Locke's few uses of it, more insight into the metaphysical connotations of it could be gleaned from an analysis of superaddere in the voluntarist literature of Locke's day. This would, for example, answer Stuart's charge against Lisa Downing that it does not make sense to superadd essential features to any kind of stuff because that would be to change the stuff, since any stuff with a different set of essential features is, by definition, a different kind of stuff (286).

My biggest disappointment with the book concerned Stuart's assimilation of Locke's categories to the Cartesian categories of substance and mode. I fundamentally disagree with the conclusion that Lockean modes are simply ontologically dependent entities, but more than that, Stuart's grounds for this contradict his own methodology. For there is no textual basis for collapsing Locke's categories of modes and qualities, and it makes hash of the semantics underlying the distinction between simple and complex ideas. It is to be wished that Stuart were as critical with the basis for this interpretation of Locke's categories as he is with most every other topic in the book.

Despite these lapses, Stuart's book shines as an exemplar of analytic history of philosophy and is a must read for anyone working on Locke's metaphysics.

[1] Peter Anstey, John Locke and Natural Philosophy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2011), 204-218.  Ironically, Anstey cites Stuart's "Locke on Natural Kinds," History of Philosophy Quarterly16 (1999): 277-296 as the inspiration for his realist reading.  Stuart lists neither it nor Anstey's book in his bibliography.

[2] "There is a point of diminishing returns in efforts to unearth or to reconstruct a philosopher's views about matters that he or she does not address directly and at some length.  Such efforts may display impressive learning about the books a philosopher is likely to have read, about the ideas that were in the air when he or she wrote, but they generate conclusions that must be regarded as highly tentative.  That is because the philosophers who demand our attention are precisely those who do not simply absorb influences and transmit them to posterity" (Preface, vii).

[3] Jeffrey Bower provides a nice introduction to the doctrine in his SEP article "Medieval Theories of Relations," The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Spring 2014 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.).