Locke's Moral Man

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Antonia LoLordo, Locke's Moral Man, Oxford University Press, 2012, 160pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199652778.

Reviewed by Margaret Atherton, University of Wisconsin, Milwaukee


Antonia LoLordo's fascinating little book covers a relatively small topic in Locke's expansive Essay Concerning Human Understanding, that of moral agency. LoLordo argues that we can pull from different parts of the Essay an account of the characteristics of agents and agency. Locke holds, she proposes, that agents are those who in their actions obey natural law, and that obeying natural law requires them to be free, persons, and rational. The core of her book is then devoted to Locke's account of liberty, personhood and rationality. How Locke treats these various notions has been highly controversial and LoLordo develops novel explanations of each concept, interestingly situated against recent accounts in the literature. But LoLordo provides something else as well -- a kind of clue linking Locke's approach to these various topics. She argues that the concept of a moral agent constitutes a particular problem for Locke because, while he thought that humans unlike other animals are indeed moral agents, he was unwilling to accept any of the metaphysical accounts that provide strict boundaries to humanity. Locke's goal, she suggests, in describing the different characteristics that go to make up moral agency is to show that we can understand what it is to be a moral agent without relying on any particular metaphysical commitments. Locke's story about moral agency proceeds on the assumption that metaphysics is unnecessary.

LoLordo's chapter on liberty provides an admirably complex account of Locke's position on agency and free action. She makes three points that are important to the interpretation she is putting forward and to her overall project. One thread that runs through the chapter is evidence LoLordo develops that Locke is explicitly not relying on metaphysics in his account of liberty. She opens by pointing out that one of Locke's earliest mentions of agency, in 1.3.14, says that if you deny that men are free and reduce them to machines then they will not be capable of following a law and, hence, morality. What is important about this passage, she believes, is that Locke makes no attempt to establish that humans are not machines, so that we can judge them to be free. He contents himself with the point that morality is incompatible with mechanism. LoLordo takes the same dynamic to be at work in the chapter on power, where she finds Locke's project to be that of giving an analysis of our idea of active power while ignoring issues of determinism and indeterminism. She shows that neither those who take Locke to be a determinist nor those who argue that he endorses agent causation have been able to produce satisfactory textual evidence for their position. This is because, she argues, Locke is genuinely agnostic on such matters. Hence, attempts to locate a position he is endorsing are attempts to answer questions he is not raising.

LoLordo's second contribution to our understanding of Locke's account of liberty is a solution to a difficulty that has attracted considerable attention. Locke gives a kind of basic account of liberty in the first edition of the Essay, from which it emerges that an act is free in case it accords with the will -- that is, the act occurred because the agent wanted to do it and that act would not otherwise have happened. Locke never rescinded and indeed often repeated this account, but in the second edition and thereafter he provides something more elaborate, now called the suspension doctrine. Locke claims that we also have the power to suspend the fulfillment of a desire and to deliberate upon it. The much discussed matter is: what is the relation between these two accounts? LoLordo proposes that the suspension doctrine encapsulates what she calls a "global" account of agency. This global account tells us that to be a moral agent requires acting on reasons, and so determining the self who acts. This is what is presented in the suspension doctrine. The initial account from the first edition tells us instead when a particular action is free. The importance for LoLordo of organizing Locke's thought in this manner is not merely that it provides consistent roles for both accounts of liberty but it also foregrounds two matters that LoLordo is going to show are central to moral agency, namely, personhood and rationality. This then is the third important point to emerge from her discussion of liberty.

There is clearly no point in suspending your desires to deliberate about your future unless you suppose your self to be something persisting through time. LoLordo therefore takes Locke's account of the idea of a person, and of personal identity (2.27) to be central to his account of moral agency. Locke's repeated attempts to demonstrate that the concept of "same person" does not track "same immaterial substance" seem to be excellent examples of an eagerness on Locke's part to reject metaphysically based accounts of personhood. LoLordo however is not content to rest here, but is anxious to develop an interpretation of Locke's views on personhood that shows them to be important to our understanding of moral agency.

She therefore argues in favor of two strategies behind readings of Locke's account found in the current literature. The first is that Locke is giving what has been called an appropriation account of personhood, under which we understand persons to be the result of appropriating past actions and feeling concerned for future actions. The second strategy, to which LoLordo has contributed the most extensive discussion to date, holds that Lockean persons are modes and not substances. This approach might be thought antithetical to LoLordo's project of revealing Locke's account of moral agency, since it is generally thought to be the case by many, including Locke, that only substances are agents. It is LoLordo's contention, however, that it is only by recognizing that persons are modes that we can appreciate the distinctive role persons can play within a science of morality. Locke claims that morality is a demonstrative science because the ideas we employ are all ideas of what he calls mixed modes, the distinctive characteristic of which is that such ideas do not presuppose a real essence that is other than their nominal essence, the abstract idea we attach to a word. Since there is no real essence outrunning what is contained in the nominal essence we ourselves put together, everything there is to know is contained in the nominal essence and so morality can be a demonstrative science.

Because 'person' is clearly a central term in moral demonstrations, LoLordo argues that a person, for Locke, must be a mode. Insisting that persons are modes, of course, opens up a Pandora's box of problems, most especially that of locating the relation between the person and the substance of which the person must be a mode. LoLordo is not afraid to tackle these problems and her excursions into substance and mode ontology are fascinating. In some ways, however, they are tangential to her central theme. Whether the account of the idea of person that Locke gives is taken to be the idea of a substance or the idea of a mixed mode does not affect the content of the idea itself: Locke is committed to the view that our idea of a person is of "a thinking, intelligent Being that has reason and reflection, and can consider it self as it self, the same thinking thing in different times and places, which it does only by that consciousness, which is inseparable from thinking". (2.27.9) This is a non-metaphysically grounded account. It thus provides LoLordo with exactly what she is arguing for, namely, that at the heart of Locke's account of personhood lies her third most important characteristic of moral agency, namely rationality.

The long final chapter, on rationality, is more diffuse than earlier ones, undoubtedly because the topic is not confined to a few chapters of the Essay, as is the case for liberty or personhood, but is instead spread throughout it. Indeed, in what LoLordo identifies as its wide sense, reason is synonymous with understanding, the subject of the entire book, and in its narrow sense, it is used to stand for reasoning or norms of reasoning, also treated throughout. The central point LoLordo wants to make in this chapter is that Locke can identify reasoning operations necessary to human moral agency by his own method of observation without recourse to claims about natural kinds with metaphysically delimited boundaries. She identifies three capacities that, she thinks, can be identified as unique to humans: abstraction, reflection and suspension, all of which can be shown to be important for moral agency. There are certainly interesting elements to LoLordo's discussion of these concepts, as, for example, her account of the difference between consciousness and at least one sense of reflection. LoLordo argues that while consciousness is spread throughout the animal kingdom, there is a sense of reflection, unique to humans, which she suggests requires attention and results in what she calls lasting ideas. Also very interesting are her reasons for rejecting Jeremy Waldron's thesis that Locke can only conclude that humans are all equal by relying on theologically based premises. But this chapter consists more in a set of interesting parts than in a sustained whole.

LoLordo wants readers of her book to accept two conclusions that Locke puts forward: a plausible and interrelated account of moral agency and that developing this account is showing the extent to which metaphysics is unnecessary for ethics. LoLordo is quite persuasive on both these matters. They are to some extent independent of one another, although it is certainly easier to accept Locke's accounts of liberty, personhood and rationality, as described by LoLordo, when they can be shown not to be full of metaphysical holes. LoLordo's interpretations of her three concepts are all interesting, although she does display a worrisome tendency to rely on distinctions unmarked in Locke's text, e.g., that there are two senses of reflection.

Her picture of Locke's avoidance of metaphysics is, I think, an extremely significant one. In fact, to my mind, LoLordo's approach can be pushed further than she is willing to take it. I found this to be particularly true in the case of her discussion of Locke's theory of personhood, in the course of which she does not resist the siren call of metaphysics. After all, the question that originally grounded her work on Lockean persons, about whether persons are substances or modes for Locke, is explicitly a question about the metaphysics of persons. I have doubts, however, about whether this is a viable project for Locke. Locke is very clear about his rejection of the assumptions lying behind a substance/mode ontology. He lampoons the idea that we can grasp the essence or nature of substance, notoriously dubbing it a something-I-know-not-what, leaving us completely without means of identifying modes dependent upon a substance. When Locke introduces the subject of substance and mode it is in 2.12, where he begins to give a classification of complex ideas. Locke's topic, throughout the Essay, and especially in Book II, is ideas, and what he is classifying in this chapter and describing throughout are not kinds of being but kinds of ideas.

We distinguish ideas of substances from ideas of mixed modes because we frame the ideas of each differently, following different rules, and not because they are different kinds of things. The rather grab bag appearance of the ideas of mixed modes has often been remarked upon, as LoLordo herself does, but is readily explained when we note that, according to Locke, we make all these different ideas in the same way. We make ideas of mixed modes by putting ideas together without reference to anything in nature. So it seems to me that the right question to ask of Locke can only be, is our idea of a person the idea of a substance or the idea of a mixed mode? Looking for an answer to this question may well yield interesting results, but we ought not look to Locke for answers about the ontological status of persons. What I am thinking is that, just as LoLordo has argued that decisions about determinism and indeterminism are not part of Locke's purview, so it is likely that the difficulties that have come up in wondering whether persons are substances or modes for Locke are the result of raising questions Locke himself doesn't answer. The upshot is that I am proposing LoLordo's accomplishment may be greater than she gives herself credit for and that Locke's dismissal of metaphysics may extend beyond its application to ethics. LoLordo has written a book that is a solid and well-supported addition to the literature, and one that will certainly be provocative.