Locke's Touchy Subjects: Materialism and Immortality

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Nicholas Jolley, Locke's Touchy Subjects: Materialism and Immortality, Oxford University Press, 2015, 142pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198737094.

Reviewed by Shelley Weinberg, University of Illinois at Urbana-Champaign







The title and focus of this book is taken from a letter written by Locke in the last year of his life to Anthony Collins, warning him not to publish work on the immortality of the soul and the resurrection of the body:

I desire you to stop your hand a little and forbear putting to press the two discourses you mention they are very touchy subjects at this time and that good man who is the author may for ought I know be crippled by those who will be sure to be offended at him right or wrong. (21 February 1704, CL VIII 206)[1]

As Nicholas Jolley notes, Locke's own treatment of these topics in the Essay concerning Human Understanding sparked a good bit of controversy, especially with one of his most well known critics, Edward Stillingfleet. That Jolley begins the book this way sets the stage for his approach to interpreting Locke. Jolley accepts both that Locke, although not a full-blown materialist like Collins or Hobbes, is a "weak materialist" committed to property dualism, and he sees what we find in the Essay generally as in the service of an encompassing polemic against Descartes. For example, Locke's commitment to weak materialism is an anti-Cartesian response to the view that the mind is an immaterial substance whose essence is thinking.

Another important motivation behind the book is to show that "Locke is a theologian as well as a philosopher" and that these "touchy subjects," mostly neglected in the scholarship, play an important role in some of the most interesting aspects of Locke's metaphysics, such as the hypothesis that matter might think, how that can happen in virtue of God's superaddition of thinking to matter, how thinking matter is consistent with the argument for the existence of God, and the theory of personal identity. Locke's theological views on the immortality of the soul and the resurrection of the dead can be seen to inform and shape these philosophical arguments. Such themes come into relief when more attention is paid to works of Locke's other than the Essay. It is impossible to do justice to the extent and intricacy of Jolley's arguments in so short a space. Perhaps I can be forgiven to provide only a mere model of how Jolley makes his case.

Jolley's interpretation of Locke's polemic against Descartes' view that thinking is the essence of an immaterial substance (chapters 1-2) is a good example of how he sees the importance of the issue of immortality to Locke's metaphysics of substance. Jolley (19) cites Margaret Wilson's insight that a Cartesian thinking substance can persist without any psychological continuity.[2] I can be the same thinking substance even through a complete change of beliefs, desires, and memories. As Leibniz noted,[3] Descartes' view of the immortality of a thinking substance does not include memory, sensibility, or anything particular to a person. Such a view of immortality, Jolley notes, is hardly morally significant and so misconceives something very important about immortality.

Citing a journal entry from 20 February 1682, Jolley states, "the target of Locke's criticism of Descartes is an argument, going back to Plato's Phaedo, which seeks to derive the soul's natural immortality from its status as an immaterial substance" (28). But "What is at issue [for Locke]," argues Jolley, "is not a state of bare substantial existence and duration, but 'a state of sensibility'". Immortality must involve something more than "a kind of indestructibility that is common to all substances". As Locke says, "to prove eternal duration may be without any perception is to prove noe other immortality of the soule than what belongs to one of Epicurus's atoms, viz. that it perpetually exists but has noe sense either of happyness or misery" (29).[4] The bigger point, according to Jolley, is that Locke uses the premise that the mind does not always think (that thinking is not the essence of the soul) to sever the necessary connection between the immateriality of a substance and its immortality. Once the soul need not be immaterial to be immortal, room is made for what Jolley sees as Locke's commitment to "weak materialism," a kind of materialism consistent with property dualism.

All three themes (weak materialism, the polemic against Descartes, and the importance of theological commitments) emerge again in Jolley's chapter 3 discussion of the cognitive abilities of animals. Jolley argues that by attacking the Cartesian dogmatic view that we are always thinking and that animals think not at all (33), Locke opens the door to a more generous view of animal consciousness, which serves the purpose of defending weak materialism, promoting the thinking matter hypothesis, and bolstering his theological ambitions (34). And, again, we don't see these purposes in Locke's arguments concerning animals until we consult (more carefully) writings other than the Essay. One example is Stillingfleet's direct objection to the thinking matter hypothesis: "if it may be in the power of matter to think, how comes it to be so impossible for such organized bodies as the brutes have to enlarge their ideas by abstraction? (LW IV 468)" (45).[5] One might remember that Locke sets the line between human and non-human animal thinking at the ability to have abstract ideas (II.xi.10-11).

Contrary to Stillingfleet's objection, as Jolley argues, it's not that thinking is a part of the natural powers of matter (45). Rather, divine superaddition accounts for how matter might think and easily accommodates Locke's view of the difference between animal and human mentality. Indeed, that superaddition plays this role is the best explanation of these differences. The reason why human mentality includes abstraction (as well as other more sophisticated activities) need not be because God has given immaterial substance to humans but not to animals, but rather that "God gives different degrees of mental faculties to matter in human beings and animals" (46). Furthermore, that God's superaddition would have this result is consistent with a metaphysics of weak materialism consistent with property dualism. Therefore, according to Jolley, it is Locke's anti-Cartesian arguments about the extent to which humans and animals think that are at the bottom of the thinking matter hypothesis.

In addition, we can see these arguments about the capacities of animals and the possibility of thinking matter to have theological ramifications. Jolley argues that Locke's responses to Stillingfleet (LW IV 466) in combination with a journal entry from 1682 show that Locke does not accept the Cartesian view that immortality is necessarily tied to immateriality (47-49). Indeed, someone with commitments both to sensation in animals and a necessary connection between immateriality and immortality faces a dilemma. Once one, in this case Stillingfleet, accepts that animals have sensation, then one must accept that either they have immaterial souls or they do not. On the one hand, if animals have immaterial souls, then one is led to accept that they must have immortal souls. But if one then denies immortality to animals, then one must deny immateriality as well, which opens the door to weak materialism -- that material things can think (have sensation). On the other hand, if one simply denies the necessary connection between immateriality and immortality, then "a standard argument for the immortality of human beings [that they have immaterial souls] is blocked. Either way, Stillingfleet is forced to accept an unpalatable conclusion" (49). And in either case, thinking matter (or weak materialism) gains ground as a possible metaphysics of substance.

In another way, Locke's thinking matter hypothesis, superaddition, and what it amounts to can be seen as a further exemplification of Locke's "implicit, ongoing debate with Descartes" (72). Developing a point made by Wilson,[6] Jolley, in chapter 5, argues that Locke can be seen to be "turning Descartes' own weapons against him" (74). Descartes admits that God can arbitrarily annex ideas to secondary qualities. What, then, would prohibit God from arbitrarily annexing thinking properties to matter? Once this possibility is acknowledged, it is hard to see how to avoid "a slippery slope towards a weak form of materialism that is consistent with property dualism" (74). Jolley admits that a Cartesian can reply that we have mutually exclusive clear and distinct ideas of matter and mind. Therefore, matter and mind are really distinct substances. But Locke can retort that, indeed, we do not have such clear and distinct ideas, for had we, there would be no problem understanding mind-body interaction. Jolley concludes, "The price that Descartes pays for his dogmatic doctrine of the mind as an immaterial thinking substance is his commitment to the unintelligible action of body on mind" (75). Locke's arguments should be seen as a clear exploitation of this price.

One of the most interesting arguments in support of weak materialism, in my view, is Jolley's reconciliation of apparently conflicting texts addressing the possibility that superaddition amounts to the emergence of thinking properties from matter. In IV.iii.6, Locke seems to say that not any matter has the power to think, but rather only "some Systems of Matter fitly disposed." To say that matter so disposed can give rise to thinking, though, is to have a very weak notion of superaddition -- so weak, in fact, that very little role seems left for God to play. Seemingly, all God would have to do is arrange the particles and set them in motion.[7] In addition, Locke seems specifically to preclude the possibility that thinking properties are emergent from "matter fitly disposed": "For unthinking Particles of Matter, however put together, can have nothing thereby added to them, but a new relation of Position, which 'tis impossible should give thought and knowledge to them" (IV.x.16). Where in IV.iii.6 Locke seems sympathetic to some organizations of particles being fit for the capacity to think, in IV.x.16 he seems, as Jolley puts it, to "dogmatically" deny it (92). Jolley offers a solution both to the philosophical problem of establishing a suitable role for God in superaddition and to the textual conflict by arguing that "God's action is necessary to give causal powers to matter for thinking, even when the particles are fitly disposed" (92, my emphasis). Just as God cannot give to just any old matter (as Jolley says, a shoe or a turnip) the power of thinking (92), God must do something in order for thinking to emerge from a suitably organized system of matter. Although Jolley's solution is tempered by his view that "Locke never seriously entertains any alternatives to property dualism," his analysis of the arguments in IV.iii.6 and IV.x is intricate, nuanced, and much more extensively considered than I have been able to show here.

As Jolley moves to the last two chapters on personal identity and mortalism, the theme of Locke's polemic with Descartes fades away and the importance of theological issues with respect to the defense of weak materialism takes center stage. Locke's theory of personal identity aims to make this theological point: the resurrection of a person entails neither the numerical sameness of an immaterial substance nor the numerical sameness of the body (100).

Once we see the importance of these theological concerns, two significant features of the theory become apparent: first, persons can have a gappy existence; second, 'person' is a "Forensick," or moral term, referring to what receives merit or punishment (101), on the basis of what it can be conscious of, or remember, having done. That is, the same consciousness, says Locke, makes the same person (II.xxvii.10). But these two significant features result in a well-known tension: that we have a gappy existence due to an inability to be conscious of all we have done seems to cut against just punishment or reward for all that we do. To resolve this tension, a good bit of recent literature on Locke's theory of personal identity has included a philosophical account, via causal relations between an original experience and a later memory or appropriation of it, to provide Locke's theory with the assurance that we are the same person and so are punished justly.[8] Nevertheless, Jolley (100) says that if we want to understand Locke's "purposes and motivations" then we have to look "with suspicion" at those attempts to offer such "friendly amendments" because they "run counter to Locke's theological motivations." So Locke wouldn't have accepted them. Therefore, Locke is happy "to leave some loose ends dangling" in his theory.

Jolley then targets John Mackie's "friendly amendment" to solve the tension as an example of something Locke would not accept due to his theological aims and commitments. Mackie argues that Locke need not worry about the possibility of being held responsible for a false memory -- say, that "George IV falsely remembers having led his troops to victory at the battle of Waterloo" -- for the theory is concerned with genuine (not pseudo) memory. A direct causal link can be forged between an occurrent memory experience and a later recollection of it. Jolley claims that such a fix won't work: "on any ordinary understanding of causality, there can be no causal links between a memory experience at the Day of Judgment and an action or experience in this life; at least, any philosopher who maintains that there can be such causal links has a lot of explaining to do" (102-103). Jolley doesn't say anything more about exactly why a causal link is impossible. He simply concludes that this sort of proposal is a non-starter due to Locke's commitment to the resurrection. "As an analytic historian of philosophy uninterested in contextual matters, Mackie does not notice Locke's preoccupation with the issue of the Resurrection" (103).

Jolley then argues that Mackie's failure to realize that a causal analysis won't work "infects his account of Locke's discussion of transfers of consciousness" (103) in the well-known passage from II.xxvii.13. I suppose Jolley means that because a causal account of how memories are genuine as opposed to false can't work, there is no distinction to be made. But still, Locke need not worry about the possibility of false memory, for once we appreciate the theological context we realize that such "fatal errors" leading to unjust punishment, as Locke calls them in II.xxvii.13, will be left up to the goodness of God to rectify. As Jolley says, "With regard to some of the puzzle cases, we must simply take comfort from the fact that we are dealing with a just and good God" (105). This is simply another of those philosophical "loose ends" Locke is willing to leave dangling due to his theological commitments.

There are certainly disagreements about how to interpret Locke's claims in II.xxvii.13 both with respect to what consciousness transference consists in and with respect to whether or not it can result in false memory. More importantly, there are more recent interpretations than Mackie's of a causal relation between an original experience and a later memory or appropriation of it that are on different sides of both of those fences. And some of these interpretations are quite sensitive to Locke's theological commitments, particularly divine rectification and/or the resurrection.[9] If it's the case that these particular loose ends need not be left dangling, then there might be a reason to think that friendly amendments in general need not be seen as suspect when it comes to understanding Locke's purposes and motivations. Perhaps the broader arguments in Locke's Touchy Subjects defending weak materialism, the anti-Cartesian polemic, and the theological motivation remain standing. Still, it seems desirable that if those friendly amendments in the scholarship are both philosophically and textually justified, then Locke (and Jolley), all things considered, might be better off taking them on board.

All in all, Locke's Touchy Subjects is a provocative reading of Locke that puts due focus on some of the less attended to writings. There are some very intriguing and persuasive arguments woven together from what we find in the Essay and other writings, especially supporting an interpretation of Locke as making room for weak materialism consistent with property dualism. Jolley portrays Locke the theist and the philosopher committed both to scripture and to some very unorthodox (and even revolutionary) philosophical ideas.

[1] All references to Locke's Essay are to ed. P. H. Nidditch, Essay concerning Human Understanding, 4th Edition, (Clarendon Press, 1975) by book.chapter.section number in the body of the review.

[2] Margaret Wilson, "Leibniz: Self-Consciousness and Immortality in the Paris Notes and After," Ideas and Mechanism: Essays on Early Modern Philosophy (Princeton University Press, 1999), p. 375.

[3] C. I. Gerhardt (ed.), Die Philosophischen Schriften von G.W. Leibniz (Wiedmann, 1978-90), vol. 4, pp. 299-301.

[4] R. I. Aaron and J. Gibb (eds.), An Early Draft of Locke's Essay together with Excerpts from his Journals (Clarendon Press, 1936), p. 122.

[5] All references to The Works of John Locke (London, 1823; repr. Aalen 1963) are in the body of the paper cited by volume and page number.

[6] Wilson, Ideas and Mechanism, p. 200-201.

[7] See Marleen Rozemond and Gideon Yaffe, "Peach Trees, Gravity and God: Mechanism in Locke," British Journal for the History of Philosophy 12 (2004), p. 388.

[8] See for example, J.L. Mackie, Problems From Locke (Clarendon Press, 1976), Don Garrett, "Locke on Personal Identity, Consciousness and 'Fatal Errors,'" Philosophical Topics 31 (2003), 95-125, Antonia LoLordo, Locke's Moral Man (Oxford University Press, 2012), Shelley Weinberg, "The Metaphysical Fact of Consciousness in Locke's Theory of Personal Identity," Journal of the History of Philosophy 50:3 (2012), 387-415.

[9] Garrett, "Locke on Personal Identity, Consciousness, and 'Fatal Errors,'" p. 120; LoLordo, Locke's Moral Man, pp. 72-74; Weinberg, "Metaphysical Fact of Consciousness," pp. 387-390, 403-412.