Locke's Ideas of Mind and Body

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Han-Kyul Kim, Locke's Ideas of Mind and Body, Routledge, 2019, 166pp., $155.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138241794.

Reviewed by Laura S. Keating, Hunter College/CUNY


In this book, Han-Kyul Kim aims to extract from Locke's various discussions concerning mind and body one positive naturalist account of the mind, one that would move us beyond the conflicting interpretations of Locke found in the literature and show the relevance of Locke's position to contemporary debates. Kim's overall claim is that Locke holds neither substance dualism, nor property dualism, nor materialism, nor a form of agnosticism, but rather gives a diagnosis of the mind-body problem against the background of emergentism. For Locke, "the mind-body problem is not a genuine problem that we are intellectually obliged to resolve, but one created by us, and oftentimes misidentified as a problem that we can and should solve" (p. 113). Kim argues that, while this naturalist-diagnostic solution has so far been unrecognized by commentators, it falls out of considering together four positions: "(1) Locke's mind-body nominalism, (2) his epistemic humility, (3) his functionalist account of substrata, and (4) his naturalist approach to the human mind" (p. 4). Kim begins with an overview of the main interpretations of Locke on mind and body and then proceeds with focused discussions of the four positions above in Chapters 2, 3, 4, and 6, noting along the way how the positions are mutually supportive. In Chapters 2, 3 and 5, he relates his interpretation of Locke to the positions of contemporary philosophers including Davidson, Langton, Lewis, and McGinn, and in Chapters 5 and 7, he further supports his interpretation by discussing how Locke was understood in his time by Burthogge, Carroll, and Priestley.

Overall, Kim's treatment of Locke on the mind is comprehensive and readers of Locke will appreciate his sustained effort to understand Locke as forwarding a naturalist position. Kim does well in engaging with the secondary literature throughout the book and in carefully delineating the different interpretations and positions he discusses. There is, however, much that is controversial and problematic in his reading of Locke. The main problems fall out of his ascription to Locke of what he calls "mind-body nominalism", which turns out to involve not only a view of our ideas of mind and body as being merely nominal, but also a perspectivalist account of sensation and reflection and of the distinction between an object's dispositional and categorical properties (I discuss only the former below). In the end, the question is whether Locke's naturalism requires a dissolution of the mind-body problem. Kim thinks it does, but it is not at all clear that Locke did.

According to Kim, the main position that commentators fail to recognize is Locke's "mind-body nominalism": "Locke conceives of the mental and physical not as properties that are irreducible to each other but as ideas or descriptions that are applied to things based on how they act or function, not what they are essentially made of" (p. 9). What are irreducible to each other are our ideas of the mental and the physical, of thinking and having solid parts. Kim claims that Locke thinks "that the mental-material distinction consists merely in certain differences between the nominal essences of mind and matter, both of which ultimately flow from the same 'Constitution'" (p. 17). Here he cites III.vi.3 from Locke's Essay:

For though, perhaps, voluntary Motion, with Sense and Reason, join'd to a Body of a certain shape, be the complex Idea, to which I, and others, annex the name Man; and so be the nominal Essence of the Species so called: yet no body will say, that that complex Idea is the real Essence and Source of all those Operations, which are to be found in any Individual of that Sort. The foundation of all those Qualities, which are the Ingredients of our complex Idea, is something quite different: And had we such a Knowledge of that Constitution of Man, from which his Faculties of Moving, Sensation, and Reasoning, and other Powers flow; and on which his so regular shape depends, as 'tis possible Angels have, and 'tis certain his Maker has, we should have a quite other Idea of his Essence, that what now is contained in our Definition of that Species.

For Kim, the passage above contains the heart of Locke's diagnostic approach to the mind-body problem:

Our human idea of man, to which the name 'man' is attached, contains the mind-body distinction. An omniscient being, by contrast, would not view the world through such nominally dualistic categories of mentality and physicality, and would consequently not see the mind and body as really distinct. The ideal perceiver's idea of reality, which we cannot apprehend since we cannot share that perspective, would not be influenced by our dualistic notions of materiality and mentality at all. (p. 18)

The mind-body problem thus arises from the mistake of our trying to construct a view of reality, either dualist or materialist, from our ideas of the material and the mental, a project that confuses these ideas with reality, for "neither of which accurately represents the 'true Nature of things' (II.xxiii.32)" (p. 33, fn. 15).

According to Kim, Locke's "nominal dualism originates with the fact that we are endowed with two modes of experience" (p. 44), "two different ways of viewing the world" (p. 9), "dual ways in which we conceive the world" (p. 130), namely, sensation and reflection:

Locke regards sensation and reflection as not only the original sources of all human knowledge but also as the two principal viewpoints that we have on the world. Although neither mode of experience is adequate to enable us to apprehend the 'true Nature of things' (II.xxiii.32), these dual modes give rise to the disparate types of primary ideas. In being 'discovered to us only by the Senses from without, or by the Mind, reflecting on what it experiments in itself within' (II.xxiii.32), these ideas are presented to us a posteriori in such a way that each word, 'mind' or 'body', carries a different meaning irreducible to the other. (p. 44)

Here Kim assimilates Locke to both Davidson and McGinn. First Davidson:

both Locke and Davidson abstain from applying the mental-physical classification beyond the level of ideas or descriptions. Physical concepts (or the idea of body) are one way of describing and explaining events, and mental concepts (or the idea of the mind) allow us to describe and explain events in another way . . . These descriptions, whether physical or mental, are our descriptions -- this is indeed the fundamental idea underpinning Locke's theory of nominal essence with regard to mind and body. (p. 48)

This interpretation is hard to square with the text. In a straightforward reading of the Essay, what distinguishes reflection and sensation for Locke are their objects. Sensation gives us ideas of qualities and powers of external bodies and reflection gives us ideas of the operations and powers of our own minds. Sensation and reflection are not considered different ways of representing the same object or action, but rather sources of ideas of different kinds of qualities, operations, and powers. In III.vi.3 above, Locke is claiming only that we do not have any idea of the more fundamental causes that are the source of those different powers and qualities in human beings.

To support conceiving of sensation and reflection as different views or perspectives on reality, Kim refers to II.xxiii.15 (p. 101). There Locke states:

Every act of sensation, when duly considered, gives us an equal view of both parts of nature, the Corporeal and Spiritual. For whilst I know, by seeing or hearing, etc. that there is some Corporeal Being without me, the Object of that sensation, I do more certainly know that there is some Spiritual Being within me, that sees and hears. This I must be convinced cannot be the action of bare insensible matter; nor ever could be without an immaterial thinking Being.

In Chapter 4, Kim argues that the "immaterial thinking Being" here is God. On Kim's view, God is needed for thought since only God has the power and knowledge needed to put fundamental corporeal particles in such arrangements that thought emerges as a higher-level feature of corporeal systems (I will return to this below). In Chapter 5, Kim cites the above passage to support the claim that with regard to thought and matter we "conceive these parts of nature in a dualistic manner" due to "the ways that our perceptual capacities happen to be" (p. 101). There he argues through a discussion of Burthogge and Carroll that Locke's mind-body nominalism combined with a God-manufactured emergence involves his holding that the substrata of "thought and matter" are the same, "these being strictly nominal entities grounded in the contingent structure of our perceptual capacities" (p. 109). Kim then goes on to argue that Locke and McGinn give basically the same analysis of the mind-body problem (pp. 109-13).

This seems wrong. Kim takes Locke and McGinn to be interested in the same problem: our inability to understand how the operation of our mind that we call 'thinking' results from physical processes in the brain. McGinn's claim is that we cannot understand this since our ideas of physical processes come from sense perception, while our ideas of thought or consciousness come from a different cognitive faculty, introspection. To comprehend what is going on when humans think or have conscious experience, we need a different source of concepts. Kim takes Locke to be anticipating McGinn:

What McGinn refers to as 'perception' and 'introspection' correspond to what Locke calls 'sensation' and 'reflection'. . . . We view the world through these two epistemic channels, but they both also block us from grasping the intrinsic nature" of the corporeal source of thinking in the brain. (p. 111)

To understand how matter and thought are related we would need a cognitive set up that does not form ideas in this dichotomous way of sensation and reflection (pp. 111-12). For such an alternative knower, such as God or angels (noted in III.vi.3), "our nominal categories of mind and body would no longer figure in it. The only way of solving the mind-body problem would thus be to become a different species for whom it would no longer be a problem" (p. 113).

One problem here for Kim's interpretation is that McGinn's problem is not Locke's. For Locke, there are two problems that arise concerning thinking matter:

(1) the question whether we think because the human body has the power to think or because it is united to an immaterial substance with the power to think; and

(2) the question whether thinking could have its ultimate origin in solid moving particles.

I take it that for McGinn, only the first option in (1) is a live option, and both that option and (2) involve basically the same conceptual puzzle, but for Locke the two are quite different. In the case of (1), dualism is real possibility, and, as Locke argues in IV.iii.6, while we are not able to understand how motions in the brain could give rise to sensations in either case, it is clear that by the power of God they could. So, for (1), the main puzzle Locke points out is that we cannot know in which manner God created us. Consistent with the passage from III.vi.3 above, the inner constitution of human beings may involve a union of two substances or may involve a certain arrangement of matter with the power to think. Kim notes how Locke attributes to the dualist the error of limiting God's power to what is included in our ideas, and remarks: "This accusation stems from the fact that, from the perspective of Locke's nominal dualism, Descartes' distinction between the mind and the body mistakenly treats what is only nominally distinct as being really distinct" (p. 81). But to understand Locke's claims here there is no need or ground for appeal to mind-body nominalism. His view that God can give a power to things that go beyond what they are made of (which even Descartes grants for motion in matter) is enough.

Further, for Locke, the question (2) above leads to a demonstration of God's existence, but it is hard to see how Kim's reading can account for this. On Kim's interpretation, God's being a thinking thing is needed for any higher-level property that requires a specific arrangement of corpuscles, such as a self-moving organism (p. 90). Thought is not a special case. (Thus, Kim holds that Locke's view about thought is just emergentism, not property dualism (p. 92).) But this does not seem consistent with a straightforward reading of the demonstration given in IV.x.5. There, the obvious premise of the demonstration is not the existence of insensibly small particles from which higher-level things emerge, but rather the existence of myself as a thinking being, together with the obvious truth, for Locke, that the power to think cannot have its ultimate source in something lacking that power.

Finally, it not clear that Locke thought that the truth of naturalism about the mind requires a diagnostic solution to the mind-body problem. In Chapter 4, Kim argues against taking Locke's remarks on the possibility of God superadding thought to matter to express an agnosticism on his part, "thereby ascribing to him no particular theory of mind" (p. 80). Kim argues instead that Locke holds that God makes it so that the powers of thought as well as of self-motion and life emerge directly as a higher-level feature of corporeal systems (pp. 92-95). Suppose we grant Kim the force of his arguments for emergentism. Mind-body nominalism does not play a direct role there. Rather Kim thinks it is needed by Locke to explain away any tendency we have toward dualism with regard to thinking and solid moving parts. Mind-body nominalism provides an answer to "why the power of thought may appear to be entirely distinct from and over and above the parts of a material system it belongs to; viz., because that system can be viewed from the nominally dualistic perspective of our 'Notions' of 'Matter' and Thinking' (IV.iii.6)" (p.83). But for Locke, the issue of the dependence of thought on our body is not merely apparent. We have a rational proof (in IV.x) that the ultimate source of thought is an immaterial being, and animals provide empirical evidence of material sentient beings. Whether we are on the side of angels or animals is a real and legitimate question for Locke. Setting aside mind-body nominalism, Kim presents strong consideration for taking Locke to class us with the latter.