Locke's Science of Knowledge

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Matthew Priselac, Locke's Science of Knowledge, Routledge, 2017, 240pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138918832.

Reviewed by Georges Dicker, The College at Brockport, State University of New York


This study of Locke's epistemology in An Essay Concerning Human Understanding is an original, ambitious, and complex monograph that also shows command of the relevant recent Locke scholarship. Although Matthew Priselac expounds Locke's epistemology as a whole, especially as presented in Books II and IV of the Essay, he says that his chief concern is Locke's "account of knowledge of the external world" (15; compare 9-11, 52, 60), and indeed his multi-layered book's most striking aspect, though by no means its only theme, is a defense of Locke's position on knowledge of the external world, or what Locke calls "sensitive knowledge." Such a defense faces at least two questions: (1) how can Locke avoid skepticism, given his doctrine that all of our knowledge is ultimately derived from simple ideas of sensation and reflection? (2) How can Locke reconcile his view of sensitive knowledge with his definition of knowledge as only agreement between ideas?

Priselac addresses these questions within the framework of an overall interpretation of the Essay's project. As his title suggests, he takes that project to be that of providing a theory or a "set of hypotheses" (71, 159, 172-173; compare 72, 177, 183) that can satisfactorily explain why what we commonly regard as "paradigmatic cases of knowledge" (160, 162-164, 166, 171, 174, 183) really are knowledge. Furthermore, this theory is intended to draw a clear line between knowledge and what Locke regards as weaker but still crucial forms of cognition -- the ones he calls "opinion," "probability," and "assurance." Indeed, Priselac frequently characterizes the Essay's overarching aim as that of clearly articulating the difference between knowledge, which he defines as "idea-containment," and probable opinion, which he defines as "[idea] conjunction without containment" (2, 7-8, 85-86, 159, 161), and he emphasizes the centrality of this distinction throughout his book (e.g. 3, 71, 74n11, 156, 158-159, 161, 167-169, 171, 174-175, 183-185, 223). Thus the Essay's goal, he argues, is not to prove that we have any knowledge, or that we have this or that sort of knowledge. Rather, its goal is to offer an explanatory theory of how, starting with the most basic elements required for any cognition at all -- simple ideas of sensation and of reflection -- we arrive at such knowledge as we commonly take ourselves to have (113).

If, in light of this theory, it turns out that a kind of knowledge we think we have is more limited than it pre-theoretically seemed to be, then the chips should be allowed to lie where they fell (9). However, the theory should at least explain how the "paradigmatic instances of knowledge" are possible, including not only knowledge of self-evident truths (among others, those Locke calls "maxims") and knowledge of the demonstrable truths that follow from them, but also knowledge of existential truths that go beyond knowledge of one's own existence and of God's existence -- notably, truths about the external world. The content of those truths may turn out to be much thinner than it pre-theoretically seemed to be (in fact, Priselac argues, it does so turn out), but if a skeptic doubts or denies that we have any such knowledge, then the explanatory power of Locke's theory as a whole justifies dismissing the skeptic (184-185; compare 11-12, 158). A skeptic who demands more than Locke can offer "wastes the time and energy of himself and others . . . and asks for something unnecessary and, besides, beyond our ken" (170; compare 160). I shall return briefly to this response to skepticism in closing.

Although Priselac takes Locke to be unimpressed by external-world skepticism, he also thinks that Locke's dismissive attitude towards it is largely counterbalanced by the slender extent and shallow depth of sensitive knowledge. He says:

Locke's analysis severely limits sensitive knowledge. We know merely that something, which appears in a certain way, really exists at the present moment . . . When I say that the paper I'm holding is real, I express my knowledge that a white thing, that is, a thing with a power to produce a particular simple sensory idea in me, really exists. In knowing that a white thing exists I know, at best, that a thing with a . . . power [to produce an idea of white] exists. (141; compare 184)

This limitation means that, even if I both see and touch a sugar cube, I do not have sensitive knowledge that a sugar cube exists -- far from it. Rather, I only have sensitive knowledge that something that has the power to produce an idea of white exists outside my mind, and that something that has the power to produce the idea of solidity exists outside my mind, but not that some one thing that possesses both of these powers exists outside my mind (142; compare 145). The latter, richer knowledge, Priselac repeatedly says, requires "the mind's activity in constructing an intelligible sensory experience from the simple ideas received through sensation and reflection" (53; compare 16, 32-36, 39-40, 42, 54, 58-59, 71, 74n11). This constructivism is an important strand in Priselac's reading of Locke -- so much so that sometimes he makes Locke sound almost like Kant, as Kant is traditionally understood (e.g. 35, 195).

In accordance with his view that Locke offers a unified theory that accounts univocally for all varieties of human knowledge (169, 172, 183), Priselac argues that "despite near unanimous opinion in the secondary literature" (11; compare 111), "Locke can account for knowledge of the existence of the external world in exactly the same terms as he accounts for other kinds of knowledge -- in terms of idea-containment" (112; compare 9, 52, 139, 172). His main thesis about such knowledge is that, just like Locke's other kinds of knowledge (identity/diversity, relation, and co-existence), it is a matter of perceiving the agreement between ideas. Priselac, then, takes on the burden of showing that, despite the intuitive view that knowledge of the existence of material things is (assuming ideas come into it at all) some sort of agreement between ideas and those things, it is really only a matter of agreement between ideas.

Specifically, Priselac's thesis is that "the ideas perceived to agree in an instance of knowledge of the external world are a simple sensory idea and an idea of a particular substance" (112; compare 10, 52, 60, 123-124, 130, 139, 141). This is a difficult thesis to grasp, for it is not clear how knowing that, e.g., a thing with a power to produce an idea of white exists amounts to perceiving an "agreement between a substance idea and a simple sensory idea of white." I did not find Priselac's attempt to document and clarify his thesis, by analyzing a passage from Locke's correspondence with Stillingfleet, of much help (119); nor did a long series of diagrams (126-138) clarify the matter. However, the thesis becomes much clearer if one bears in mind that for Priselac, idea-agreement means idea-containment (83, 85; compare 7-8), so that his thesis, as he finally says, is equivalent to saying that to have sensitive knowledge of real existence is to perceive that a substance idea contains a simple sensory idea (141; compare 139, 146).

But now Priselac's proposal seems problematic, for it seems that even in a hallucination or a dream, one can perceive that a substance idea contains a simple sensory idea. I may hallucinate a piece of white paper, in which case it seems that I perceive a substance idea that contains a simple idea of white; or dream of a warm stone, in which case it seems that I perceive a substance idea that contains a simple idea of warmth. But in neither case do I have sensitive knowledge of the real existence of any material thing.

Priselac's response to this objection, if I understand him correctly, would be surprisingly straightforward. It would turn on his interpretation of what a "simple sensory idea" is. He writes: "as passively received through sensation, simple sensory ideas are our contact with reality, the world beyond our mind. A simple sensory idea is an idea of reality in that it is produced in us by the real world" (146; compare 22, 136). Priselac provides substantial support for this interpretation. Early in the book, within the context of a subtle analysis of Locke's notion of a power to produce a simple sensory idea, he brings out by implication that such an idea is essentially one that has an external cause. In later passages, as in the "contact-with-reality" passage just quoted, this interpretation becomes very explicit. Thus, after endorsing the view that "the 'idea of sensation' [is] a kind of idea . . . received through sensation," Priselac says, "sensation, for Locke, is a technical term -- it is the passive reception of ideas in the understanding as a result of things outside the mind operating on it" (121; cf. 139, 183), and he refers to "a sensation in Locke's sense of the term 'sensation' as a route by which things distinct from the mind affect the mind" (149n17). So, for example, "as I see the sun, my idea of it consists of ideas of actual sensation -- ideas produced in my understanding by the sun operating on me" (120). To put it another way, on Priselac's reading, Locke's simple ideas of sensation, unlike ideas of sensible objects in Descartes, or impressions of sensation in Hume, or empirical intuitions in Kant, or sense-data in Price, Russell and Moore, or ways of being appeared to in Chisholm and company, already include an "objectivity concept." As Priselac also says: "Simple sensory ideas are all real, adequate representations of the . . . power . . . to produce them. The idea can't at that time exist without the quality existing. Even the madman has sensitive knowledge of real existence insofar as he has some sensory experience" (145).

There can be no doubt that this characterization of a Lockean simple idea of sensation fits what Locke says when introduces ideas of sensation in Essay II.i.1, as well as many other passages. I shall not try to defend here a more Cartesian take on Locke's view of simple sensory ideas; nor do I mean to suggest that such a defense would be textually better warranted than Priselac's interpretation. However, I think that his interpretation undermines his basic thesis that sensitive knowledge is a matter of the agreement of ideas (idea-containment). For if the mere having of a simple sensory idea already entails "contact with reality," and if, as Priselac rightly notes, "all ideas as they are in the mind are perceived to be the ideas they are, according to Locke," then in simply perceiving a simple sensory idea, I thereby already know that some external thing is causing that idea, whether it "agrees with" or is "contained in" any other idea or not. The reference to any other idea is simply otiose.

Priselac comes close to recognizing this objection, for he says, "this agreement [of ideas] is relevant [to sensitive knowledge] in that it is a perception of agreement in which one component is passively received -- the simple sensory idea" (130). This seems to acknowledge that the simple sensory idea is the only component that, so to speak, anchors the collection of ideas that enter into a substance idea to reality. The fact that it "agrees with" (is contained as a proper part in) a certain complex idea adds nothing to its "reality."

To be fair, Priselac anticipates the objection, for he says, "merely receiving simple sensory ideas is not sufficient for sensitive knowledge on Locke's view. This is because merely receiving simple sensory ideas is not yet to think of a substance. Knowledge of the real existence of a substance, of course, requires us to think of a substance" (125; compare 129-131).

However, in light of the "thinness" of sensitive knowledge on which Priselac insists, this seems to me to be a weak response. For when I both see and touch (e.g.) a sugar cube, all that I sensitively know is that there now exists something that has the power to produce the idea of white in me and there now exists something that has the power produce the idea of solidity in me, but I do not sensitively know that there now exists one thing that has both of these powers. So, what does my knowledge that I perceive a substance amount to? The answer depends on what a substance is.

In Essay II.xxiii, Locke distinguishes between the idea of a particular substance such as lead or water, and the idea of substance in general, as that which "supports" the qualities of a particular substance. In a long and insightful chapter on substance in Locke, Priselac slices these two ideas into four, so as to disambiguate whether the idea applies only to a particular thing or indifferently to many things, in which case it would be a Lockean abstract idea. Thus, Priselac distinguishes four senses of 'idea of substance' within Locke's work:

Idea of substancesupport: The characteristic component of all substance ideas . . . to which qualities are bonded in forming substance ideas.

Idea of a substanceparticular: an idea of a particular individual substance, such as my idea of the apple on my desk. It is composed of ideas of qualities that are all bound together and then put together with the idea of substancesupport to constitute my idea of an existentially independent thing which does and can affect my mind and other substances in various ways.

Idea of a substancekind: an idea of a kind of substance, such as my idea of apples. These ideas are formed by abstracting away the particular circumstances and qualities of ideas of substanceparticulars.

Abstract Idea of substance in general: an idea that philosophers trade in, an idea of a metaphysical kind or category, acquired by abstracting the idea of substancesupport out of our ideas of substances. (59)

Since sensitive knowledge "is not a perception of agreement involving abstract ideas" (117), but always pertains to particular individual things, the relevant sense of the phrase "idea of substance" for defining sensitive knowledge would initially seem to be "idea of a substanceparticular." In that case, the knowledge would be sensitive knowledge of co-existence (of the substanceparticular's qualities). As Priselac notes, this is indeed something that both Locke countenances and regards as a species of agreement between ideas (143-145). But such knowledge presupposes sensitive knowledge of the real existence of the co-existing instantiated qualities (the instantiated Lockean "powers" to produce ideas in our minds) included in a collection of qualities, and that more basic knowledge is not a matter of agreement between ideas. Furthermore, given the above-mentioned "thinness" of sensitive knowledge, the only knowledge that counts as sensitive knowledge per se is the knowledge that a single quality, associated with a single simple sensory idea, inheres in or is "bonded to" a single substancesupport. But this too is not a matter of an idea agreeing with or containing an idea; it is a matter of an idea being produced by the operation of a power/quality that, it is thought, cannot be conceived to exist without a substance/substratum to support it. Furthermore, this thought is one that Priselac himself effectively criticizes (63), for although he recognizes that for Locke, "[the] idea of substancesupport is the defining or characteristic feature of substance ideas" (57; compare 63), he also argues convincingly, on familiar albeit sharply-stated grounds, that this idea is bankrupt -- that "we have no idea of that which provides the support" (63; compare 69, 196).

Although Priselac is highly critical of "substancesupport," nonetheless he uses its vacuousness to argue for an astonishing claim. In the book's final chapter on "Locke and Idealism," he argues that "Locke's account of sensitive knowledge is compatible (italics in original) with Berkeley's metaphysics of sensible objects" (194; compare 11). Simply put, his argument is that since substancesupport is "that which provides [or whose sole function is to provide] the existential support and unity of the qualities which compose the substance" (196; compare 54, 57), and since "our substance ideas . . . represent neither the nature of the unity nor . . . the depth of the ontological independence" of a substance, therefore "Locke's account of our idea of substances "funds a . . . lightweight metaphysics of substances" (53) -- it is "compatible with a wide range of metaphysics of sensible objects" (196). In particular, "it makes clear that Berkeley's sensible objects have the independence and unity we take substances to have according to Locke" (198). Priselac defends this claim at length, by pointing to certain features of Berkeley's metaphysics, especially that the laws of nature ordained by God, in virtue of which collections of ideas are organized, are independent of human minds and their volitions.

It seems to me that this line of thought trivializes Locke's response to skepticism. For external-world skepticism, as I understand it and as I think Locke and other modern philosophers understood it, essentially questions whether we can know that our sense-experiences are caused by the very objects that we take ourselves to perceive. But on Berkeley's view, as Priselac recognizes (206), our sense-experiences are really caused by God instead of by the objects we think we perceive. Furthermore, it is not even possible for those objects to cause the experiences, since they are composed of the experiences, which cannot cause themselves. Finally, I see no reason why, on Priselac's view, Locke could not concede with equanimity that our sense-experiences might just as well be caused by Descartes's evil demon as by material objects.

To conclude: I do not find Priselac's attempt to reconcile Locke's view of sensitive knowledge with his definition of knowledge convincing, and I believe that his rapprochement between Locke and Berkeley is misconceived. Nevertheless, I think that Locke scholars who work through Priselac's rich book will profit from the effort. For in addition to the book's innovative interpretation of the Essay as a whole, it contains several subtle, insightful episodes that I have not had the space to discuss, including accounts of how complex ideas are formed from simple ones (5-8), of the distinction between "mere general powers" and "normal powers" to produce simple sensory ideas (23-32), of the difference between trifling and instructive knowledge (92-99), of Locke's distinction between knowledge tout court and "real knowledge" (144-145, 162-163), and of still other topics. As for the stance toward skepticism that Priselac plausibly attributes to Locke, described earlier in this review, I think it gives less credit to skeptical arguments than they deserve. But Priselac's position is only the modest one that "Locke's curious engagement with skepticism . . . recommends a place for Locke in the early modern canon of contributions to the understanding of and struggle with skepticism" (156), and it would be silly to dispute that. So my assessment of that engagement funds at most a criticism of Locke rather than Priselac, and reflects an epistemological orientation that there is no space to defend here.

A closing note: I counted almost 60 misprints; most are minor but a few are sense-destroying (e.g. 25 lines 13 and 24, 37 line 7, 152n39, 191n51).