Logic and How It Gets That Way

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Dale Jacquette, Logic and How It Gets That Way, Acumen, 2010, 306pp, $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781844651429.

Reviewed by Byeong D. Lee, Sungkyunkwan University, Seoul


Our conceptual system has evolved over a long period of time, but it might still contain some fundamental misconceptions. We are not God, after all. Our logical system is no exception. According to Jacquette, the ideas we have about logic and the formalisms we use to express logical relations have evolved through the development of analytic philosophy, but contemporary analytic philosophy still suffers from a number of historically inherited principal misconceptions about formal logic and its relation to thought, language and the world.

Logic is an indispensable tool for philosophers. Thus it is certainly worthwhile to ask and answer these questions: What is logic? How does it get that way? According to Jacquette, logic gets to be the way it is by dealing with conceptual problems and logical paradoxes in our thought and use of language, and so the best way to answer these questions is to examine such conceptual problems and logical paradoxes. For this reason, throughout the book, Jacquette presents and examines various central difficulties for standard ways of thinking about classical quantificational theory, the extensionality of truth functions, Frege's sense-reference distinction, reference and predication, and the explanatory role of the concept of truth in a theory of meaning. In particular, he considers the opposition between extensionalism and intensionalism as the most fundamental opposition in philosophical logic and semantics, and he wants to show that intensionalism definitely defeats extensionalism.

Throughout the book, Jacquette offers a number of thought-provoking or "idiosyncratic" arguments for some of the most interesting problems of logic and philosophical analysis. In addition, most of these arguments are very subtle and delicate. Thus, unfortunately, I cannot do justice to them in this short review. For this reason, I shall just illustrate some of his main claims, and mention briefly why I find them problematic.

In Chapter 2, Jacquette investigates the expressive limitations of standard quantificational logic by discussing the difficulty of properly formalizing a sentence of the following sort: (S1) Some monkey devours every raisin. We may formalize this false sentence as '(∃x)(Mx & (∀y)(Ry→Dxy))', where 'Mx' stands for 'x is a monkey', 'Ry' stands for 'y is a raisin', and 'Dxy' stands for 'x devours y. Now let us consider another sentence, which we get by substituting 'raisin' with 'craisin', where craisins are imaginary nonexistent fruits: (S2) Some monkey devours every craisin. According to Jacquette, if the general form of the above symbolization is correct, then we ought to likewise symbolize (S2) as '(∃x)(Mx & (∀y)(Cy→Dxy))', where 'Cy' stands for 'y is a craisin'. (S2) is clearly false, but standard quantificational logic takes '(∃x)(Mx & (∀y)(Cy→Dxy))' to be true, because nothing satisfies 'Cy'. According to Jacquette, this sort of expressive inadequacy indicates that we should replace classical logic by an alternative non-classical logic. His preferred choice is an intensional or Meinongian logic. Admittedly, standard quantificational logic is not an all-purpose tool, so that it is bound to have some expressive limitations. Does this fact urge us to replace it by an alternative non-classical logic? The aforementioned problem might not lie in its formalization.

On my view, the problem arises rather from the truth-functional definition of the conditional, according to which the conditional is taken to be vacuously true when its antecedent is false. As the so-called paradoxes of material implication show, the truth-functional definition of the conditional is not without its limitations. Nonetheless, we use this definition because it works okay for the primary purpose of correct reasoning. To see this point, consider the following modus ponens: A. A→B. ∴ B. In the case where 'A' is false, the second premise 'A→B' is vacuously true, but we cannot derive the conclusion 'B' because the first premise 'A' is false. Consequently, we don't need to worry about inferring a false conclusion. But the truth-values of sentences containing imaginary or fictional predicates can be a completely different matter. Thus the proper lesson of the aforementioned problem might be that such fictional sentences need a different treatment, while classical logic is all right for non-fictional sentences.

In Chapter 3, Jacquette raises an interesting question regarding the extensionality of truth-functional connectives. By using the concept of a sententially dedicated constant truth-function, he presents a counterexample to the thesis that all truth-functions are extensional. Sententially dedicated constant truth-function δ takes the truth-values of a particular sentence S, and maps the truth-values of S, T or F, onto T. For any sentence S* other than S, δ maps the truth-values of S*, T or F, onto F. Now take S* such that S* ≠ S and S* ↔ S. Due to the definition of δ, we cannot substitute truth-functionally equivalent sentence S* for S in δ[S] without changing the truth-value of the whole. Thus Jacquette claims that there is an intensional truth-function.

So what? As is well known, the stock of intensional expressions such as 'it is necessary that' and 'believes that' is very large. That is why we have many intensional logics such as modal logic, tense logic, epistemic logic, and deontic logic. Jacquette seems to think that the existence of such an intensional truth-function raises a question about a formal criterion of truth-functionality. But the concept of function and the concept of truth-value are both well-defined concepts. So is the concept of truth-functionality. It is definitely a good thing that the standard truth-functional definitions for logical connectives such as negation, conjunction, disjunction, and the conditional are extensional. For we can thereby use the truth table method for the purpose of evaluating arguments containing such logical connectives. But it is not clear what problem the existence of such an intensional truth-function as δ poses for our standard logical analysis.

In Chapter 4, to further discredit extensionalism, Jacquette criticizes Frege's diagnosis of the cognitive import of non-identity statements. According to Frege's extensionalist approach, co-referring singular terms must be intersubstitutable salva veritate. Jacquette provides an interesting counterexample to Frege's theory. Let us assume that α is the name of something other than its own name. Now note that 'α' ≠ α for any name 'α'. For instance, 'Aristotle' Aristotle, because Aristotle's name is not identical to Aristotle himself. Jacquette claims that there arises a serious semantic embarrassment for some assignments of referents to 'α'. Consider a case in which α refers to the property of being a property. According to Jacquette, "[we] find unequivocal implicit commitment in Frege's writings to the thesis that the sense of a singular referring expression, proper name or definite description is the complete set of properties belonging to the expression's referent", although this thesis can ultimately be inconsistent with Frege's other proposals (pp. 71-2). Thus we can take the sense of the name 'α' to be all of α's properties. Since α's only property is the property of being a property, the sense of the name 'α' is the property of being a property.

As is well known, in order to deal with substitution failure in indirect speech, Frege claims that the sense of an expression, in indirect speech, determines its indirect reference rather than its direct reference, and that its indirect reference is its ordinary sense. Indirect reference occurs in referentially opaque linguistic contexts, and referential opacity occurs whenever the uniform intersubstitution of co-referring singular terms fails to preserve truth. Consider the following sentence: 'Seoul' has two syllables. If we substitute 'Seoul' by a co-referring singular term 'the capital of Korea', we get a false sentence: 'The capital of Korea' has two syllables. Thus referentially opaque contexts include the cases of mentioning a proper name. According to Jacquette, in the above non-identity statement, 'α' (mentioning the name on the right-hand side of the non-identity statement) refers to its customary referent, the property of being a property, and "'α'" (mentioning the name of the name that appears on the left-hand side of the non-identity statement) refers indirectly to its customary sense, which coincides with the property of being a property. Consequently, when α is the property of being a property, 'α' = α. According to Jacquette, this absurd consequence provides further evidence for intensionalism.

But this counterexample seems implausible. Let us leave aside the question of whether Frege is really committed to the view that the sense of a singular referring term is the complete set of properties belonging to the expression's referent. Still, we had better not interpret the aforementioned non-identity statement as a case of indirect discourse. 'α', which appears on the right-hand side of this non-identity statement, is a name. "'α'", which appears on the left-hand side, is also a name, although it refers to the name 'α' rather than the property of being a property. In this non-identity statement "'α'" is used to directly refer to the name 'α', and a name of the name doesn't have to be a quoted name. We may use an unstructured name 'A' instead of "'α'". Then it holds without any quotation marks that A α. This non-identity statement is not referentially opaque. For this reason, we may take it that 'A' directly refers to its customary reference (that is, the name 'α'). Likewise, we may also take it that "'α'" directly refers to its customary reference rather than its customary sense.

In Chapter 5, Jacquette gets down to what he considers to be the most fundamental disagreement in philosophical logic and semantics, namely, intensional versus extensional logic and semantics. He thinks that we can see this opposition most conspicuously in the conflict between purely formal semantics and intensional semantics. In order to illustrate the implausibility of formal semantics, he criticizes Davidson's truth-conditional semantics. According to Davidson, a Tarski-style theory of truth for a language L can serve as a theory of meaning for L, and such a theory of truth can be tested by evidence that it entails all T-sentences. According to Jacquette, such a truth-conditional semantics is bound to be circular. Suppose that our object language is German and the metalanguage is English. Then an adequate theory of truth must entail the following T-sentence: 'Es regnet' is true if and only if it is raining. According to Jacquette, in order to relate the German sentence 'Es regnet' biconditionally to the English sentence 'it is raining', we need some independent method of determining the truth-value of the English sentence. But we cannot determine its truth-value without knowing what it means. Therefore, Davidson's theory is bound to rely on a prior understanding of the meaning of metalanguage, so that his formal semantics is circular as a general theory of meaning.

Due to reasons of this sort, Jacquette offers an intention-based semantics as an alternative. He claims that his intentional theory of meaning can avoid the circularity of a formal semantics by appeal to the content of the relevant intentions of thinking subjects. Above all, however, Jacquette's objection to Davidson's theory is not persuasive. According to Davidson, an adequate theory of interpretation must meet the compositionality constraint and the empirical adequacy constraint as well. The latter constraint demands that the theory be verifiable without assuming a detailed knowledge of the speaker's propositional attitude. In other words, the theory must not beg the question by assuming too much of what it is supposed to explain. According to Davidson, the evidential base for the theory of truth consists of facts about the circumstances under which speakers hold sentences of their language to be true, and such evidence is neutral as between meaning and belief and assumes neither.

I don't deny that Davidson's notion of 'holding true' is somewhat controversial as a satisfactory starting point where a radical interpretation begins. But Davidson's theory is not circular in such a way that Jacquette indicates. Here it is worth noting that anyone who wants to offer a semantic theory for a language cannot help but use some language. For this reason, the fact that a semantic theorist relies on a prior (implicit) understanding of his metalanguage to offer a semantic theory is not a problem in itself. Meaning is a theoretical concept. Thus a semantic theorist's job is done if he can explain this theoretical concept by virtue of philosophically less controversial concepts. In addition, Jacquette's intentional theory of meaning also faces the problem of circularity. For one thing, to find out what intentions a person has typically involves knowing what the expressions of his language mean. For another thing, as Davidson insists, mental content and linguistic meaning are fundamentally of coeval conceptual status. For instance, the linguistic meaning of 'red' and the mental content of red are simply two sides of the same coin. The meaning of 'red' is fixed by the concept of red, and vice versa. Thus we can hardly provide a non-vacuous explanation of speech acts by virtue of intentional states.

In Chapter 6, Jacquette discusses the concept of truth and its role in the theory of meaning. He first distinguishes between constitutive truth and regulative truth. A constitutive concept of truth purports to reveal the nature of truth. By contrast, a regulative concept of truth does not attempt to explicate the nature of truth; it only tries to provide a goal or a standard of reliable information conveyance that can effectively guide our practical truth-seeking descriptive and theoretical activities. Jacquette is very skeptical about explicating the nature of truth, and so he advocates a standpoint of a regulative concept of truth. On his suggestion, we can understand the regulative concept of truth as a positive correspondence between a proposition and the state of affairs that serves as the proposition's truth maker; and this regulative concept of truth can guide our knowledge and action because we can maximize truth by maximizing the positive correspondence between our thought and the world.

I will not go into details here, but I think this regulative concept of truth is problematic. Firstly, 'It is true that snow is white' and 'It is a fact that snow is white' are equivalent ways of saying the same thing. Thus they do not express two distinct things, one of which is made true by the other. Secondly, we cannot get outside our conceptual system so as to compare our judgment that p with the fact that p from an external point of view. Thus the so-called positive correspondence between our thought and the world is epistemologically unavailable to us. Thirdly, the deflationary view of truth is nowadays becoming more and more influential among truth theorists. On this deflationary view, truth is not a substantial concept, so that we should not understand it in terms of positive correspondence even as a regulative concept. Jacquette does not seem to do justice to this deflationary view of truth.

Finally, in Chapter 7, Jacquette discusses various logical and semantic paradoxes, such as the liar paradox, Grelling's paradox, and the preface paradox. According to him, logical paradoxes are symptomatic of deep incongruities in our thought and use of language, and so we can understand the limitations of our logical system by dealing with them. Some of Jacquette's proposals in this chapter are novel and interesting. But I will not discuss them here for lack of space.

The questions this book deals with are certainly worthwhile ones which deserve close investigation. This book also offers a rare opportunity to think about the limitations of our standard logic and semantic analysis from an overall perspective. But Jacquette seems to deal with too many issues to be adequately handled within the compass of a three-hundred page book. This is particularly so because he makes unapologetically "idiosyncratic" claims on a number of important problems in logic and semantic analysis.