Logic of Imagination: The Expanse of the Elemental

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John Sallis, Logic of Imagination: The Expanse of the Elemental, Indiana University Press, 2012, 302pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253005908.

Reviewed by Janae Sholtz, Alvernia University


Mature, poetic, erudite, fantastical -- John Sallis' new book is a concrescence of all these, appropriately so, given the characterization therein of imagination as a gathering force which allows the simultaneity of disparates and eludes the logic of non-contradiction. Whereas too often the conversation concerning Heidegger's legacy ends in explaining the necessity of another beginning, Sallis takes us there, offering rich descriptions and creating new concepts, essentially, giving us food for thought and a new vision for Da-sein. This book records the maturation of a philosophical path, the uniqueness of that journey, and the realization of a lifelong encounter with Heideggerian phenomenology. One can detect residues of Sallis' entire oeuvre, perhaps the clearest attempt to articulate a "third kind" [the chora] begun in Chorology, continuing the interrogation of imagination's role in thought initiated in Spacings: of Reason and Imagination and, most explicitly, expanding upon the analysis of self-showing found in The Force of Imagination.[1]

Another Beginning, Another Logic could very well be the subtitle of this book, as it seems clear from his emphasis on Socrates' second sailing and acceptance of the Nietzschean-inflected Heideggerian diagnosis of the end of philosophy that Sallis is initiating what might be a third or fourth sailing. Sallis takes on the task of articulating another beginning for philosophy with a lucid analysis of the metaphysical paradigms that have circumscribed philosophy and now serve as its impasse. He sets the tone by utilizing Shakespeare's The Tempest to invoke a twofold, the relation between logos and physis, which marks the inceptive moments of philosophy. The Tempest also doubles as a metaphor for the movement of the book and an image of elementality, as Sallis poetically weaves logic, metaphysics, art, imagination, the sensible and the cosmic, which, like the concurrence of the elements that form a tempest, presents us finally with a vision of the elemental and the place of the human within it.

The book is divided into seven chapters and a prelude. Aptly, the book has its own spatial dynamic, which effectively folds logic and imagination together, doubling our vision and compelling the reader to consider their belonging. The book also enacts the figural cadence indicative of the logic of imagination, a spiraling motion that returns to beginnings only to unearth their supports in order to draw together and elevate the abyssal moments which then propel us further into the matter of thought. Each chapter is preparatory, attuning the reader towards an open receptiveness to anterior attestations (191), not once but severally. In the first half, Sallis articulates a logic of things, yet also works to undo this history, excavating the sense of logic, its development and its excess or residual, culminating in chapter three, where he develops the productive nature of imagination via the elaboration of an exorbitant logic loosened [or intensified] by thinking through the Freudian dream-work. In these first chapters, Sallis prepares the idea that what lies underneath, imagination as a logos before the sedimentation of logos as logic, has done so all along, an echo of the emphasis on anteriority to come. Essentially, we belong to imagination, and it is always operative in our apprehension, drawing together the enchorial spacings that provide for the manifestation of things in the first place. Thus, Sallis has primed the reader from the start for its centrality.

In the second half, the force of imagination underwrites the text. In what follows, and which may be considered the most provocative sections of the text, Sallis crafts a lexicon of figuration and elementality, as well as offering an image of the human as a relational and open corporeal event. Based on the implications of understanding the fundamental power of imagination as gathering contradictory elements, the logic of imagination opens up vistas hitherto unthinkable, at least not by a tradition dominated by the rule of non-contradiction. In the last chapter, Sallis presents a challenge to philosophy, to engage with speculative physics and the most radical scientific hypotheses concerning the cosmos. In doing so, as the thesis goes, philosophy may discover a new humanity as well as a new earth. Readers will be best prepared if they have previous knowledge of Sallis's work, as he understandably relies upon the interpretive schema produced through the immense body of his earlier writings.

In the prelude, "Precursions", Sallis' navigates the reader through the inceptive decisions that set the parameters of Western thought. Referring to Socrates' second sailing, he locates the founding differentiation between the intelligible and the sensible. Socrates' turn to logos in order to make sense of things represents a deferral of vision, a priority which remains active, regardless of the fact that this deferral is momentary. Yet, claims Sallis, both logical and imaginal moments persist within the history of philosophy, beginning from Plato's eikasticimplementation in the service of empowering the upward movement of thought. The crux of Sallis' argument is that the "sensible must be understood otherwise than as a remote image of the intelligible . . . [which necessitates that] the logical moment of philosophy must be reoriented to the sensible" (13), without merely repeating the Nietzschean reversal of priority between the sensible and the suprasensible. Strictly speaking, this is what Logic of the Imagination does. As anyone familiar with Sallis' work would know, the Heideggerian undertones are unmistakable; Sallis means to launch another beginning at the limit or end of philosophy, twisting free of certain decisive metaphysical preconditions.

In order to do this, he must engage in serious historical excavation, which he accomplishes with precision and rigor, providing a forceful summary of the developments of logic from ancient into modern philosophy. "The Logic of Contradiction" (Chapter 1) begins soberly with an account of the Platonic and Aristotelian origins of logic. In terms of discourse about being, the primary consideration is determination, arresting the flow of the immediate by locating beings as this and not that. Thus logos is circumscribed by contradiction, and "the discipline that will be called logic will be a logic of contradiction" (39). Moving from Kant to Hegel, Sallis draws out significant moments for the evolution of logic, while showing how each maintains the thread of contradiction. In particular, Sallis explains that the Hegelian Aufhebung re-instantiates contradiction into the heart of being as the most extreme possibility of Aristotelian logic, its inversion, a thinking that places being and thinking at the limit of contradiction rather than being prohibited by it.

Following Heidegger, Sallis avers that what is required is the rethinking of the limit [of contradiction], rather than either persisting with opposites or progressing to their unity. In "Formal Logic and Beyond" (Chapter 2) this aim is deferred as Sallis traces the Husserlian project of the philosophic grounding of logic, beginning with a pure logic "that would formulate laws that govern the ideal relations pertaining to the object of thought" (69). Leading us through Husserl's phenomenological critique of formal logic, Sallis identifies the double movement between formal and transcendental logic, which demands a genetic tracing of predicative structures to their pre-predicative origins, or receptive experience (84). Sallis explains that it is Heidegger who recognizes the need to expand beyond the traditional Platonic parameters of logic, thus deconstructing logic through a more originary thinking of poetic logos.

"Exorbitant Logic" (Chapter 3) traces the limits of logic. This investigation returns once again to the beginning, to Aristotle in particular, and the implicit connection between two parallel developments in Western philosophy -- metaphysics and logic -- as decisive clues for how to begin again. What is discovered is the need for a logic that twists free of the covert demands of the "ontological paradigm of things" (105); what is needed is a logic that addresses the originary openings in which things first come to show themselves, a logic of schemata, spacing, and imagining. Sallis develops what he calls an exorbitant logic through a surprising twist, a discussion of Freud's Interpretation of Dreams. Dream-work illuminates a kind of thinking that allows and maintains contradiction. Analyzing the transformation of dream-thoughts into dream-content, Sallis identifies several schemata (spatio-temporal determinations) such as simultaneity and spatial proximity that correspond to various logical categories. In each case the key feature is the yoking together of contradictory terms in a unity that neither destroys the terms nor cancels either of them. Such a logic is exorbitant with respect to Aristotelian logic and is definitively connected to phantasy as that which permits contradictory belonging. As it turns out, this is decisive not just for psychoanalysis, but also provides Sallis with a model for what must be thought, a thinking to come.

"The Look of Things" (Chapter 4), the book's crease, identifies, in the look, an exchange between speech and imagination that enacts a folding of the two which characterizes the logic of imagination. The look is more than merely sensible apprehension; it a "crystallizing and intensifying [of the] antecedent manifestation" (127) brought about through the supplements of determinateness, enacted by speech, and of horizonality, enacted through the capacity of the imagination to hover between opposites. The unity of the look is itself a kind of doubling. "Thematizing the exchange [between speech and imagination] is to engage in the logic of imagination" (140), and is preparatory for moving beyond the look as a gathering of things to the elemental antecedents making self-showing possible in the first place.

From there, proceeds the fantastical -- in "Schematism" (Chapter 5), Sallis launches the reader into a vision of the future of thought, indeed the future for philosophy: the "beyond" of the sensible (147). As he has insisted throughout, this is a thinking of the sensible that is not reduced to it -- now understood as elementality. Elementals are neither things nor properties, thus "the law [traditional logic] that would govern the belonging of properties to things has no bearing" (151). Instead elementals provide jointures and horizons of things, disclosing their fundamental event-like nature. Thus the elementals and imagination share a special bond, as the imagination gathers and holds together the spatio-temporal dynamics of the elementals, opening spaces, which Sallis refers to as schemata, for the self-showing of things. Sallis launches into a discussion of the geometric figures indicative of certain schemata, linking the spiral to the manifold of schemata as indicative of open, unlimited extension. This is perhaps the most difficult section to follow in the book, but warranted given the implication that it is facility with the modes of imaginative thinking that we lack.

"Proper Elementals" (Chapter 6) begins with the question of finitude, which, Sallis counters, can only begin by addressing the infinite and, moreover, by framing a third concept of the infinite that is neither the infinite of [mathematical] progression nor the infinite of sublation [of the finite]. The resulting determination of the philosophical [concrete] infinite as indefinite excess allows Sallis to posit a coherent structure by which to determine and differentiate the elementals, as well as position the human in relation to them. A formula emerges: locate the concrete infinite by identifying that which exceeds indefinitely, the othermost, and look for the reversion that discloses the properly human, our ownmost. Thus, our ownmost is tethered by the excess of the plurality of the infinities/elementals and reversion from them, a bi-directional relatedness to the elementals, which opens the primary site of the proper (206). This plurality is a fourfold, the most manifest being the natural elementals, "set within the enchorial spacing bounded by sky, earth, sea" (212) and returning us to ourselves as encompassed and exposed.

Next, there is sheltering retreat, a developed account of Heideggerian concealment as seclusion and depth that discloses the unforeseeable moment of sheer advent. These represent two complex opposed directionalities on an axis of verticality. Completing the schema are the horizontal dimensions of birth, as that which can never be reached but which provides the texture of our being-in-the-world; and death, submitting us to the absolute and necessary contingency, uncertainty and fragility of our existence. These elementals are held open through the hovering gathering of imagination, which discloses the in-between space of human finitude. Sallis' development of the regions of elementality maps nicely onto the Heideggerianfourfold and helps us understand what Heidegger meant, while at the same time going beyond the elusiveness of Heidegger's schema. Thus, Sallis does us the favor of envisioning the possibilities of Heidegger's fourfold; though, and perhaps redundantly, a familiarity with Heidegger would greatly aid in what Sallis is trying to do.

In the final chapter, "Elemental Cosmology", Sallis traces transformations in our view of the cosmos, from Ptolemaic to the modern view initiated by the discoveries of Copernicus,Kepler, and Galileo. These discoveries shattered the view of the celestial spheres and the uniform distance of the stars to the earth, providing for advances in understanding the sheer magnitude of the expansiveness of the universe, the presence of billions of galaxies and stars as big as a million suns. Thus this all-encompassing vastness bordering on the incomprehensible surpasses all the indefiniteness and contradictions of the natural elementals. The cosmos makes the elementals contradictory, thus engaging the force of imagination. So powerful is this vision of the beyond that the natural elementals themselves are reconfigured through these cosmological supplements: "As vision opens to the expansive cosmos, there is a reflexive effect on the self-showing of the natural elements" (252); and, by extension, the space of propriety is likewise reconfigured.

Reminding us that it was the Greeks who operated from the original insight that the question of space is essentially related to our understanding of nature, Sallis next considers the traditional vision of the universe as endless void, with its underlying supposition of empty, immovable [Newtonian] space, in light of phenomena such as dark matter, cosmic radiation, and dark energy. These phenomena suggest that vast expanses of what was hitherto considered empty space are thoroughly permeated, dismantling the Newtonian vision of the cosmos and opening a possible re-imagining of the relatedness of matter and space. The final question of the book, one that is most essential given the relation of self-showing to the elementals, the cosmic, and our transformed understanding of space, is how to take up these discoveries philosophically. By stretching imagination toward cosmic infinities, we may also accomplish the reversion indicative of the self-disclosure of human finitude, but, Sallis admonishes, if we merely maintain the inversion of the sensible/supersensible, we may be left with a view of the utter insignificance of humankind, nihilism. Rather, we must deconstruct this opposition and, through the vantage of the logic of imagination, reorient ourselves to the sensible, in order that "the elementality of the cosmos, its higher orders of infinity, may prove to have the capacity . . . to elevate the human, to draw the human up to a new sense of propriety" (278).

There are many little jewels in this book, for example, re-envisioning Hume's theatre as a model of the coming to pass of self-showing (208), employing Bataille to broach the utter excessiveness of the secluded as inassimilable depth and darkness (220), and using Freud's psychical model of the preconscious and the unconscious to illuminate the concealedness of seclusion (222), while resisting the interiority associated with it. Additionally, Sallis' dismantling of the concept of consciousness opens the Freudian discoveries anew, demanding a rethinking of the body (229). The book also strikes this reader as providing fruitful opportunities for engaging post-phenomenological projects of elaborating the real conditions of experience, since both are concerned with reworking our understanding of the relation between the sensible and sense and attempt to uncover that which remains opaque to thought as the condition of its anterior genesis.

Principally, Sallis does an exceptional job in striking a balance between his fidelity to the Heideggerian call for another beginning, and his imaginative projection beyond Heidegger. He augments Heidegger's characterization of the belonging together of Dasein and Being with the double relatedness of the [properly] human to the elementals.  Ereignis becomes vividly palpable through the elementals of the natural (sheltering, birth and death), and the exceeding depth of the sensible is revealed and made manifest. Incorporating the link between infinities and human finitude into our understanding of Dasein as an opening or clearing helps us understand just how that clearing comes about. As a space of propriety, always already extended and determined through the relation to the elemental as impropriety, our "proper" requires the resonating, hovering capability of the logic of imagination. Perhaps, Heidegger's project cannot be accomplished without the logic of imagination. I will leave it to the reader to determine whether Sallis has completed this project. For my part, I am interested to pursue Sallis' other beginning.

[1] John Sallis. Chorology: On Beginning in Plato's "Timaeus" (Indiana University Press, 1999); Spacings -- Of Reason and Imagination. In Texts of Kant, Fichte, Hegel (University of Chicago Press, 1987); Force of Imagination: The Sense of the Elemental (Indiana University Press, 2000); other conceptual parallels include his work in Being and Logos: The Way of Platonic Dialogue (Indiana University Press, 1975) and, of course, Sallis' hallmark strategy developed in Phenomenology and the Return to Beginnings (1973) is clearly evidenced.