Logica, or Summa Lamberti

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Lambert of Auxerre, Logica, or Summa Lamberti, Thomas S. Maloney (tr.), University of Notre Dame Press, 2015, 442pp., $64.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780268035358.

Reviewed by Allan Bäck, Kutztown University


This translation of the Summa (or Logica) of Lambert, commonly said to be from Auxerre, is a useful addition to current translations of medieval texts, in particular logical ones. Thomas S. Maloney, the translator, also has written extensive notes and a long introduction. The translation is reliable, with some caveats noted below. The book is very well produced, with a good bibliography.

Lambert's Summa was one of the main logic texts used to teach students in the mid-thirteenth century. The other main ones are William of Sherwood's Introductiones in logicam, with recent translations into English and German, Peter of Spain's Tractatus, with a recent translation into English, and Roger Bacon's Summulae dialectices, also translated by Maloney. There is some contention about which of these logic texts is original and whether some borrow from others. Maloney thinks that all four are original relative to one other, although all four were using common material, like the works of John le Page and. obviously. of Boethius and Aristotle. He also thinks that Lambert's Logic is the most sophisticated of the group, at least with respect to pedagogy. (xliii) I agree with that claim as Lambert writes in a clear and organized way. He states the doctrines, presents objections, and gives their solutions. Yet we find little of the theoretical subtleties of an Abelard. Rather we find someone giving a clear exposition of the logical tradition of Boethius, augmented by more recent developments, such as those of the authors in the Logica Modernorum (ed. Lambertus Marie de Rijk, 1962-7).

Lambert though doesn't strike me as a particularly insightful or original logician. For instance, he says, "Logic is the science of distinguishing the true from the false by way of argumentation." (4; 4,22-3 -- these numbers are to the Latin edition of Lambert's Logica, ed. by Alessio, 1971) Here Lambert is following those like Averroes. (in Aristot. Phys. I. 7 4 (IV 11vb) Surely by modern logical standards this definition is lousy. In medieval times, too, for instance, Buridan is more perspicacious, when he describes logic as dealing with valid and invalid inferences. (Summulae de Dialectica, Preface,) Again, following Boethius, Lambert says that logic deals only with names and verbs. (9,1) But he then has to discuss the copula 'is' and syncategoremata like 'every' and 'if'. If I had to talk thus, I would say that, as logic is formal, it deals primarily with syncategorematic terms, and secondarily with categorematic names and verbs. Except for the end of the book, Lambert mostly follows the tradition of Boethius, which can be seen in his account of the square of opposition and his acceptance of the A to I inference there. (21) Still the Logica does have some logically interesting doctrines, perhaps with some originality: the account of relatives (289; 235,3ff.,) and the use of the fallacy of secundum quid et simpliciter to solve the Liar Paradox. (230; 186,30ff.)

The Introduction has quite an exhaustive discussion of the identity of Lambert. It both cites the primary historical evidence and has detailed summaries of the positions of various scholars on this issue. As Maloney puts it, he has given "a tour de force of all the relevant literature" -- with some repetitions. (xxxviii) Perhaps he felt bound to do this, as he has changed his mind from his position in a 2009 article, where he held that Lambert was not a Dominican while he wrote the Summa. He also concludes that the author of the Summa was Lambert of Ligny-le-Châtel, not Lambert of Lagny. (xxxix) Lambert likely wrote the work in stages during the 1240's and 1250's.

I don't mind the wealth of historical detail. However, I also would have liked to see more discussion of the logical doctrine included: just how original was Lambert? why is his work better than that of the other logic manuals -- especially as, so Maloney says, his own, Dominican order preferred using Peter's Tractatus, except perhaps in the convent schools. (xxxiv; xl) Surely the work of Albert the Great, done at about the same time, has much more sophistication and detail, e.g., on fallacy. (Cf. Bäck, On Reduplication 1996, 180-5)

What is the intended audience for this translation? Maloney says: those who cannot read Latin; those who read Latin a little; those who read Latin well but might want to consult the translation on a phrase or two. (xliv-v) But which groups of such people? I guess: specialists in medieval logic -- and perhaps those with some interest, like scholars of medieval philosophy and some medievalists. But Maloney does not offer much background material about the logical doctrines in the Introduction and the Notes. Rather, he spends a lot of space on the current state of research into Lambert's book and rehearses the views of the relatively few scholars who have written on Lambert. He does help to provide historical philosophical context by referring to texts in earlier authors of the Logica Modernorum and in those like Boethius (very little Abelard). But it would be nice to have more analysis of the logical doctrines of Lambert that would be accessible to philosophers and logicians in general -- for instance, in the discussion of modality de re and de dicto . 33-5) Maloney does not offer a glossary of technical terms, although you can retrieve that information via the Index, e.g., for 'equipollence'.

Along with the translation, Maloney offers corrections of the Latin edition of the Logica, edited by Franco Alessio (which I too admit has its problems) listed by Maloney in Appendix A. However, he has made these corrections without consulting the manuscripts. As he puts it, the changes that he has made "are not based on a reading of the manuscripts but on what one speculates Lambert's original text might (or should) be." (xliii) I find this method dangerous. The changes, albeit quite defensible, are sometimes not minor: e.g., changing 'opponendo' to 'appobnendo' (35,37); using 'prius' instead of 'posterius'. (50,27)

Furthermore, Maloney has inserted a lot of interpretative material into his translation. Perhaps for the better, so as to give a more coherent reading; perhaps for the worse, as it may distort the text. For instance Maloney translates: "Ut novi artium auditores plenius intelligant ea que in summulis edocentur, valde utilis est cognitio dicendorum." (3,3-4) as "A knowledge of things to be used is said to be very useful so that new students of the arts may know more fully what is taught in their summulae."

Still, the translation is mostly reliable and clear, like the original text. Sometimes it might be more user-friendly: e.g., using 'convertend' and 'converse' for 'convertens' and 'conversa', instead of something like 'the original proposition' and 'its conversion'. Again Maloney translates "omnem hominem verum est esse animal" (34,18-9) as "for every man it is true that he is an animal", and even says, n. 114, that he is not translating the Latin literally as the result would be quite stilted. But why not the simpler (and more literal?), 'it is true that every man is an animal', with a note explaining that the translation has changed the scope of the 'it is true that' operator? My suggestion might have trouble with the de re and de dicto formulations at p. 40. But their difference could be handled thus: taken de re we have 'every man is truly an animal'; taken de dicto 'it is true that every man is an animal'.

Other times the translation is not that literal. For instance in defining 'supposition'. Lambert says , "Quarto modo dicitur suppositio acceptio termini per se sive pro re sua, vel pro aliquo supposito contempto sub re sua vel pro aliquibus suppositis contemptis (corrected by Maloney to: contento sub re sua." (206,30-3) Maloney translates, "In the fourth way supposition is said to be the acceptance of a term for itself or for its (signified) thing, or for some suppositum )logically) contained under its (signified) thing, or for more than one suppositum contained under its (signified) thing." Here the translation had added significant content: by adding 'signified' in its translation for 'sua re' so as to get 'its (signified) thing '. This perhaps is no quibble, as, for Lambert, signification is the relation of a word to a concept. However, supposition need not have a relation to a thing signified by its concept. For instance, 'man' signifies the concept man; however 'man' in material supposition does not, as in 'man has three letters'. Also, Maloney has taken 'contento' to be "(logically) contained". Well maybe but the containment is not purely and formally logical but more ontological: the supposita have to be put under the term. Lambert is thinking of what goes under what in the Porphyrian tree(s) accepted by the Aristotelian tradition. Although the connection between concepts may be logically necessary, as with the relation of species to their genus, the connection between a species concept and the individuals falling under it is not logical or formal but material, just as Britney and Justin fall under the human species. For they are contingent beings.

Some other examples: translating 'totum de modo' as a "modal whole" (127,12), although accurate, will confuse a modern reader. Likewise for translating the fallacy of 'figura dictionis' as that of "the Figure of a Word". (146,39) 'Begging the Original Issue' is a literal and precise translation for 'petitio principii', but 'begging the question' has become traditional. (173,26) Again, using 'snub' instead of 'simian' for 'simus' in 'simus secundum nasum' would link up Lambert's discussion with the Aristotelian tradition better. (184,33) Again, why leave 'fenix' in the Latin, instead of translating it as 'phoenix' -- there is a lot of medieval literature on the sophism 'omnis phoenix est'. (51,12) Again, why have the more literal "things that come after the categories" instead of the more usual 'postpredicaments'? (p. 117)

Malone translates the false conclusion, 'poeta est alba', as 'a poet is white'. But, as its premise has it that whiteness is in the poet, the conclusion looks true. The fallacy, of the figure of speech, lies here instead in 'alba' being 'a white female thing''. (170,26) Again, consider the translation "A singular is what is predicated of one thing alone, as is 'Socrates' and 'Plato'." (50,21) By putting in the quote marks, Maloney has implied that predication is a relation between words and not between things for Lambert. Perhaps, but it would be nice to see some discussion of this issue in the Notes.

The Notes are extensive. Their main content lies, first, in repeatedly comparing Lambert's views with those of William of Sherwood and Peter of Spain (non-Papa), who also wrote Summulae at around the same time, and earlier Latin authors, like those contained in the Logica Modernorum, edited by De Rijk. Second, Maloney presents in much detail the views of various modern scholars on Lambert. As Lambert is not studied that much, Maloney ends up discussing a few authors, e.g., De Rijk and Alain de Libera, quite a lot. I think that a reader would get the idea about those contemporary sources and the secondary literature without so much repetition. Instead it might be more helpful to discuss the logical doctrines themselves, such as the logical import of the modes of the contingent distinguished by Lambert. (pp. 46; 56) The notes do not offer much explanation of Lambert's doctrines in a way that would be helpful to a modern logician or to a medieval neophyte. Nor does Malone use the Greek commentators much. This becomes evident in his claiming that Lambert (unlike his contemporary textbook writers Peter and William, although like Bacon) takes 'truly' and 'falsely' to be modal operators. p. 352 n. 96 Yet the original use of 'mode' allows for that; as in modifiers of the verb. Cf. Ammonius, in de Int. 214,25-6; Jonathan Barnes, 'Ammonius and Adverbs' in Henry Blumenthal and Howard Robinson (1991) 145 -- 63.

The notes are generally clear. I see only a few problems: When Lambert speaks of the Fallacy of the Contingent, does he mean the fallacy of accident, or what? (49,29) On converting relative opposites, Lambert cites Aristotle's Prior Analytics. (135,35-6) Maloney, p. 167, n. 6, suggests instead, quite plausibly, Categories 7b18. However Lambert may indeed have had in mind Prior Analytics I.36. It would have been useful to note that Lambert's etymology of 'amphiboly' (152,37) is spurious. Maloney translates 'dici de omni' as "'to be said of all". (112,37) In his note 58, he might have explained the status of the dictum de omni in the syllogistic. At 74,18, Maloney might explain what a 'topic' is here. At p. 112 n. 87, he seems to say that Bacon wrote the passage quoted from the Six Principles, and not Gilbert de la Porrée.

Still, despite these quibbles, Malone has produced a useful book.