Logical Form: Between Logic and Natural Language

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Andrea Iacona, Logical Form: Between Logic and Natural Language, Springer, 2018, 133pp., $89.99, ISBN 9783319741536.

Reviewed by Gilad Nir, University of Leipzig


The notion of logical form plays various roles in contemporary philosophy. It is appealed to when we evaluate the validity of arguments; it is said to underlie the structure of sentences; it forms part of theories of meaning; and it figures in debates over the kind of commitments we undertake in asserting sentences. Andrea Iacona's book aims to undermine the idea that there is a single unified notion at the basis of these various philosophical practices.

The book advances the following argument. There is a widespread assumption, which is wrongheaded according to Iacona, that there is a single notion of logical form that can serve two distinct roles. The first is the role assigned to it by compositional semantic theory, where logical form is conceived as part of the input on the basis of which we grasp the meaning of sentences. The second is the role assigned to it by logic, where it is called upon to explain the validity of arguments, the logical relations of consistency and contradiction between asserted sentences, etc. Semantic theory, Iacona argues, cannot account for the logical validity of all arguments -- for instance, it fails when these arguments involve context-sensitive, vague expressions, and non-standard quantifiers. This is so since in such cases, the semanticist holds that content is only determined at a post-semantic stage, but there are, according to Iacona, distinctly logical properties that first show up when the full asserted content is in view. What is required to account for such cases is an alternative notion of logical form, according to which the bearers of logical form are not sentences of natural language but what we say by means of such sentences, i.e. the content they express on particular occasions. This second notion of logical form, for its part, would not be suitable to serve the role reserved for logical form in semantic theories (for reasons which will be made clearer below). Iacona concludes that there is no single conception of logical form which can adequately serve both the semantic and the logical roles.

The book's nine chapters are grouped into three parts. The first part (Chapters 1-3) consists of a historical study of the notion of logical form. Chapters 4-6 lay out the central argument, described above. In Chapters 7-9 Iacona develops the "truth-conditional notion" of logical form, according to which logical form is the property of content. The majority of the material -- Chapters 4-9 -- has already been published in various peer-reviewed journals. The point of collecting these publications and combining them into a monograph is that taken together they lay out a single, unified argument.

I begin by discussing the systematic arguments advanced in the second and third parts, and I then turn to discuss what I consider to be particularly problematic in the historical account offered in Chapters 1-3.

According to Iacona, semantic theorists of various stripes (including Davidson, Montague, Lewis, Kaplan, Neale, Stanley, Borg, and others) share the assumption that the notion of logical form that figures in semantic theory is also capable of explaining the logical properties and relations of sentences. But the semantic notion of logical form cannot fulfill this logical role, for instance, when it comes to sentences that involve context sensitivity. When you say "I'm a philosopher" and I say "you're not a philosopher", in a particular context, our disagreement does not turn merely on the difference between the way we evaluate the truth of each of these sentences; there is a genuinely logical relation between them, namely, a contradiction, such that it cannot be the case that both sentences are true (p. 48). The semantic theorist that Iacona has in mind ascribes logical form to each of the sentences independently of the other, and independently of the particular context; this results in her not being able to account for the logical relations that are affected by the logical features of the context.

By contrast, the "truth-conditional notion" of logical form takes the bearer of logical form to be the content expressed by a sentence on a particular occasion. Iacona does not commit to any particular theory of content, but shows instead that the truth-conditional notion would be compatible with various theories of propositions (55). An important feature of this approach to logical form is that sentences of natural language do not perspicuously wear their logical form on their sleeves:

This means that there is no such thing as "the" logical form of a sentence. Sentences have logical form relative to interpretations, because they have logical form in virtue of the content they express. (p. 60)

But logical form understood in this way is not well-suited to serve in a compositional theory of meaning of a learnable language, for if logical form is not discernible from the sentence itself, prior to its assignment to a context, it cannot be the kind of input by reference to which competent speakers of the language grasp meanings. Indeed,

a linguistically competent speaker can fail to know the logical form of an argument. . . . The apprehension of the logical form of s may require substantive empirical information. (p. 82)

Hence Iacona's conclusion: there have to be two distinct notions of logical form, which are equally legitimate, but serve two distinct purposes.

In the third part Iacona advances a series of arguments designed to show that the truth-conditional notion of logical form is preferable to the semantic notion when it comes to explaining a wide range of phenomena, including non-standard quantifiers, vague expressions, and equivocation. For example, consider how the two approaches to logical form diverge with respect to the treatment of non-standard quantifiers such as "more than half of". The semantic theorist will tend to simply deny that we can account for the validity of arguments involving these expressions in terms of logical form. But there is an intuitive sense in which such arguments are good in virtue of their form. On a particular occasion, we would not be led to error if we take the sentence

(1) more than half of the professors in the philosophy department are happy,

to yield the conclusion

(2) more than two professors in the philosophy department are happy.

Clearly, on a different occasion, (1) could be true while (2) is false, namely when there are only three professors in the philosophy department. But on this occasion, too, there would be some other inference that would seem valid, e.g. from (1) to (3):

(3) more than one professor in the philosophy department is happy.

The goodness of each of these inferences, in their respective contexts, seems to depend on the form of what the sentences express. But since the semantic theorist ascribes to (1) the same logical form in all contexts, she is unable to explain these inferences as logical.

Iacona seeks to convince us that such inferences are good by virtue of their logical form. He argues that despite the fact that "more than half of" is not first-order definable, it is "first-order expressible". By this he means that in any given interpretation, the logical form of sentence (1) can be captured by means of some first-order formula which embodies all the relevant logical properties that the original sentence has in that interpretation. Thus, in any interpretation there would be some cardinal number, such that for sentence (1) to be true in that interpretation is for the intersection of the set of professors and the set of the happy to be greater than that number. This general fact explains why we have the intuition that sentence (1) entails other sentences in virtue of its logical form (p. 108).

The logical form of the content of sentences employing non-standard quantifiers will be different in different interpretations. According to the formal criterion of logicality that Iacona develops, these quantifier expressions therefore count as "non-logical" (p. 121). And yet Iacona's point is that these non-logical expressions have a recognizable inferential role to play, i.e. that they determine logical form. This is an interesting claim, though it may be wondered how one finds oneself in the awkward position of having to ascribe both logical form and non-logicality at one and the same time. Perhaps to be consistent Iacona had better avoid thinking of logicality in terms that tie it too closely to first-order logic.[1]

Of the three parts of the book, it is the first, historical part, that I find to be the weakest, at least when one attempts to judge it as a genuine piece of scholarship rather than as a preamble to Iacona's systematic argument. Iacona's discussion remains squarely within the bounds of the received account of the history of logic, and fails to engage with contemporary interpretive debates over the aims and achievements of past philosophers. In Chapter 1, Iacona elicits from the works of Aristotle, the Stoics, Abelard and Leibniz two important ideas. The first is that logical form is the structure which is revealed when we investigate the validity of arguments, by abstracting from the specific content of the sentences which make them up. The second is that in sentences of natural language, logical form is often disguised. In Chapter 2, Iacona describes Frege, Russell and Wittgenstein as proponents of what he calls "the old conception" of logical form. On the old conception, logical form can only be exhibited by a logically perfect language, in which the syntax perspicuously reflects the semantics (p. 22). This contrasts with a central feature of the "current conception" of logical form, which Iacona traces back to Tarski, Davidson, and Montague, in Chapter 3. The current conception is primarily concerned with the ascription of logical form to the sentences of natural language. It situates logical form within a theory of meaning that is modeled on Tarski's semantics for formal languages, where uninterpreted sentences acquire definite truth-conditions relative to models (p. 35).

But Iacona's way of drawing the contrast between the pre-Tarskian approach to logic and the contemporary approach to logic obscures the crucial difference. According to his account, what seems to matter most is the question of what kind of language it is in which one discerns logical form; but if one is to get at the heart of Frege's conception of logic, or Wittgenstein's, or Aristotle's, one must consider it in light of the idea that logical form is the form of thought. Kant, a major proponent of this view, is not mentioned once in Iacona's book; in Frege, this idea is radically transformed, but it is still discernible, for example in the identification of the laws of thought and the laws of truth.

The importance of this idea can be seen by considering two further issues that Iacona neglects. Form as such is a principle of unity; accordingly, logical form is that which binds thought (or propositions) together. This plays a crucial role in Kant's theory of judgment; it leads Frege to draw a fundamental distinction between the saturated and unsaturated elements of a thought, i.e. between objects and concepts. A similar concern with the unity of the proposition leads Russell to propose that logical form is one of the elements which enter the relation of the judger to what is judged. Iacona does mention that Russell's appeal to logical form appears in the context of his multiple-relation theory of judgment (p. 21), but he does not explain what problem Russell hoped to thereby solve.

There is a related issue which Iacona neglects. In both Frege and Russell, and even more explicitly in Wittgenstein, there is a concern with the very possibility of articulating the fundamental logical distinctions between the elements that make up a thought. This comes out in Frege's discussion of the inevitable failure of his attempt to express the distinction between the saturated and unsaturated elements of thought. Consider the sentence "a concept is not an object"; since "is an object" is a first order predicate, it only yields a senseful proposition when saturated by a name of an object, but by hypothesis, concepts do not fulfill the functional role of naming objects, so the sentence either fails to say anything about concepts, or it fails to make sense at all.[2] Russell, reflecting on similar issues, writes that if we tried to treat logical form as a constituent of judgment, "it would have to be somehow related to the other constituents, and the way in which it was related would really be the form; hence an endless regress. Thus the form is not a constituent."[3]

For Wittgenstein, the unintelligibility of our attempt to talk about logical form becomes the central topic of discussion. On the view under consideration in the Tractatus, logical form is the underlying common structure of thought and reality. But since logical form informs all thought, it is not something about which one could have a proper theory, since we cannot occupy a standpoint outside it -- we cannot separate logical form from that which it informs. It seems to follow that attempts to ascribe or deny logical form to the expressions of our language (or any language) are irreparably nonsensical. To then say that natural language disguises logical form cannot mean, for Wittgenstein, that the result of clarifying the expressions of our language (e.g. by translating them to a logically more perspicuous notation) is the discovery of a genuine piece of theoretical knowledge about logical form. Rather, the clarificatory role of formalization is to dispel the confusions that arise when philosophers misunderstand language, in ways that encourage them to advance substantive metaphysical claims on the basis of their conception of logical form. One application of this method of clarification can be seen in Wittgenstein's suggestion that a clear symbolism would make it impossible to give expression to Russell's paradox, and his claim that this fact shows that Russell's theory of types is in fact superfluous.[4]

Perhaps not every book on logical form must engage with these issues; but any book on logical form that includes a chapter devoted to Wittgenstein, Frege and Russell must at least mention the central problems which they took the notion of logical form to involve. Indeed, given the deep differences between the early-analytic approach to logical form and the approach adopted by philosophers of language in the second half of the 20th century, it might have been better for Iacona to avoid the historical discussion altogether, and frame his main argument more narrowly as a response to the way in which the notion of logical form is currently deployed. Iacona realizes this when he admits that it is not clear whether and to what extent Frege, Russell and Wittgenstein can be said to have shared the assumption that he wishes to reject (p. 40).

Iacona sometimes expresses the central thesis of his book in the form of a sweeping claim: "there is no such thing as a correct answer to the question of what is logical form" (e.g., p. 127). But put in this way the claim is more ambitious than what the argument warrants. What it seems to warrant are the two weaker claims that the notion of logical form deployed in semantic theory is insufficient for explaining all the logical properties we seem to ascribe to asserted sentences, and that there is another notion of logical form that can account for these logical properties, but is not suitable for a compositional-semantic theory. So, we may sum up the central thesis of the book more modestly, as follows: there is no single notion of logical form that fulfills these two distinct roles. This is a thesis worth debating, and we should thank Iacona for furthering our understanding of the debate.

[1] My thinking about this issue owes much to a conversation with Dan Kaplan.

[2] Gottlob Frege, “On Concept and Object” in Collected Papers on Mathematics, Logic, and Philosophy. Edited by B. McGuinness. Translated by Peter Geach. Blackwell 1984. pp. 182–194.

[3] Bertrand Russell, “What Is Logic.” In Logical and Philosophical Papers 1909-1913: The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell Vol. 6. Edited by John Greer Slater. Routledge 1992. p 55.

[4] Ludwig Wittgenstein, Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus. Translated by C.K. Ogden. Kegan Paul, Trench, Trubner & Co. 1922, #3.331-3.333.