Logical Investigations, Volumes 1 and 2 and The Shorter Logical Investigations

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Husserl, Edmund, Logical Investigations, Volumes 1 and 2, trans. J. N. Findlay with a new Preface by Michael Dummett, edited with a new introduction by Dermot Moran, Routledge, 2001, Volume 1: 331 pp, $29.95 (pbk) ISBN 0-415-24189-8; Volume 2: 334 pp, $ 29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-415-24190-1.

Husserl, Edmund, The Shorter Logical Investigations, trans. by J. N. Findlay with a new Preface by Michael Dummett, edited with a new introduction by Dermot Moran, Routledge, 2001, 422 pp, $ 27.95, (pbk) ISBN 0-415-24192-8.

Reviewed by Daniel Dahlstrom, Boston University


These two paperback editions of Husserl’s Logical Investigations – the first of which is a complete edition, the second an abridged edition – are most welcome. For years students and teachers of Husserl’s “breakthrough” work, as he calls it, have had to contend with the original hardcover edition that was almost as inaccessible as it was expensive. Not only can members of graduate seminars now avail themselves of a reasonably priced, complete edition, but teachers of undergraduate students can introduce them to this rich work in abridged form at a relatively inexpensive price. Of course, one always pays an additional price of another sort for an abridged edition, a matter discussed below. Nevertheless, for all the inevitable shortcomings of an abridged edition, Moran’s edition of The Shorter Logical Investigations can be put to good use in certain pedagogical settings.

Adding to the attractiveness of these editions are their prefaces and introductions. The preface is the same in both editions as is the introduction (though the abridged edition adds a few opening pages). In his brief preface Dummett notes the importance and potential of the work, given its timely appearance prior to the divide between analytic and phenomenological traditions. Moran’s substantial introduction is richly documented (the footnotes are a treasure trove) and lucidly written. The introduction contains several discussions that can be divided into three broad sections: an opening section on the origin of the text and its place in Husserl’s development, a middle section on the specific contents of the Prolegomena (the original first volume of the Logical Investigations) as well as that of each of the six Logical Investigations, and a brief concluding section on the influence and contemporary relevance of the work and on the translation itself. I shall say a word about each of these sections, before turning to the differences between the two editions.

In the opening section, Moran begins with some brief but well-chosen remarks on the original publication of the well-received first volume of the Logical Investigations in 1900 and the two parts of the less well-received, but ultimately more significant, second volume in 1901. He then gives an account of the meaning of ‘phenomenology’ as Husserl understands it when he describes the Logical Investigations’ aim as a “phenomenological founding of logic.” The account of the “emergence of phenomenology,” as Moran dubs it, is succinct, accurate, and well-placed in the early pages of the introduction. Perhaps less helpful to those who are being first introduced to Husserl’s thought and the Logical Investigations in particular is the cursory review that Moran proceeds to give of the role played by the work in Husserl’s development, as viewed in part by Husserl himself. After providing an informative sketch of Husserl’s life, Moran gives a good account of the biographical and theoretical origins of the Logical Investigations (including the reasons motivating Husserl’s break with psychology and Brentano). There is also a valuable review of the self-criticisms, external criticisms, and reorientation that contributed to the specific character of the published revisions of the first five Investigations and the incomplete revisions of the Sixth Investigation.

In the middle section Moran sketches central themes of the first volume of the Logical Investigations: The Prolegomena to Pure Logic, namely, Husserl’s argument against psychologism, his contast of formalization with generalization, and his revival of the traditional idea of pure logic as an a priori, independent, theoretical science, indeed, a “science of science.” In this connection, after indicating how the Prolegomena represents a departure from Husserl’s earlier Philosophy of Arithmetic, Moran gives a very balanced assessment of the difficult matter of Frege’s influence upon this departure. In contrast to the straightforwardness of the Prolegomena, the six Logical Investigations proceed in a circuitous, “zig-zag” manner, occasioned by Husserl’s tendency to dwell at length on opposing positions and work out his own views in a constantly provisional manner, always aware that more needs to be said about the distinctions made. Nevertheless, Moran claims that, despite “Husserl’s labyrinthine presentation,” the work is “more united” than it appears. Although Moran does not, in my opinion, provide enough reasons to support this, in my opinion, dubious claim, he does correctly note that Husserl’s overriding concern is to clarify the cognitive achievements in which we grasp ideal objectivities. With this concern in mind, Moran proceeds to give thumbnail expositions of each of the six Logical Investigations. These lucid, occasionally critical accounts of the general themes of each investigation are peppered with suitable references to sources of these themes among Husserl’s contemporaries (e.g., Marty, Twardowski, Stumpf) as well as to revisions that these themes undergo in Husserl’s subsequent writings.

The concluding section contains some useful comments on the influence and contemporary relevance of the Logical Investigations as well as on Findlay’s translation. The impact of the work on the German, French, and English philosophical scene is duly noted as is its potential as a resource for current analytic philosophy of mind and consciousness. As far as the translation is concerned, Moran acknowledges its limitations but defends the decision to reissue it. He argues that, for all the faults of Findlay’s translation, it remains serviceable and a new translation, while “certainly desirable,” will take considerable time during which students should not be deprived of access to Husserl’s text. This reasoning strikes me as sound though I would like to underscore the need for a new translation. (To give but one example: Findlay uses the term ‘legal’ rather than a more likely candidate like ‘legitimate’ or ‘lawlike’ or even ‘law-governed’ to translate ‘gesetzmäßig’ where the latter modifies the relations among theories that it is the business of a particular science – formal mathematics, pure logic – to investigate; see Logical Investigations, Vol. 1, p. 157.) A new translation should also indicate the differences between the various editions more clearly and consistently than Findlay does. The second German edition alerts the reader to newly-added material by printing it in a smaller font. Some such device would make it unambiguous to the reader of the translation that the passage is not part of the original 1900/01 edition, especially given Husserl’s proclivity to introduce this material in a variety of ways (e.g., by employing the terms ‘Zusatz,’ ‘Anmerkungen,’ and ‘Note’).

The abridged edition is approximately a third shorter than the complete edition, leading to the question of the difficult choices that the editor had to make in producing the abridged version. Among the passages omitted from the abridgment of the Prolegomena, perhaps most noteworthy are what Husserl dubs “the empiricistic consequences of the psychologistic standpoint and their refutation” (§ 21), his critical reviews of the particular psychologism of Mill and Spencer (§§ 25-29, including the appendix on “general defects of empiricism”) as well as the anthropologism of Sigwart and Erdmann (§§ 39-40), and, finally, his concluding remarks about logic and formal mathematics (§§ 70-72). The omission of § 21 strikes me as particularly unfortunate since it contains an important element of Husserl’s argument against psychologism, based on contrasting logical principles’ exactness and necessity with the vagueness and probabilistic character of psychological laws. So, too, the omission of the final sections (especially § 70) deprives readers of an insight (autobiographical as well as systematic) into how Husserl conceived the tasks of pure logic in relation to formal mathematics or, more precisely, its latest development as a doctrine of manifolds. The omission of the other sections is more understandable, given the fact that the arguments against the doctrines of the authors mentioned iterate arguments in sections that have been retained.

The abridged First Logical Investigation retains most of Husserl’s rich opening account of expressions and meaning – including the important introduction of the difference between sense-giving and sense-fulfilling acts (§§ 9-10) – but omits the second chapter on “acts which confer meaning” (§§17-23) and the fourth chapter on “the phenomenological and ideal content of the experiences of meaning” (§§ 30-35). These omissions are regrettable but understandable in an abridgement as are the sections that are principally omitted from the Second Logical Investigation (“The Ideal Unity of the Species and Modern Theories of Abstraction”), namely, the bulk of Husserl’s extensive criticisms of Berkeley’s doctrine of representation and Hume’s theory of abstraction (§§ 25-42). Another difficult, but perhaps understandable decision by the editor is his decision to leave much of Husserl’s discussion of Stumpf-inspired notions of inseparability and fusion (§§ 5-9) and Husserl’s treatment of “the differences among a priori relationships holding between Whole and Part, and among the Parts of one and the same whole” (§§ 15-20) out of the abridged version of the Third Logical Investigation. While the abridged Fourth Logical Investigation retains most of the relevant material leading up to the important distinction between nonsense and absurdity, it regrettably omits the final section (§ 14), containing Husserl’s thoughts on a theme mentioned in the title of this investigation, namely, the idea of a pure grammar. For the abridged version of the Fifth Logical Investigation the editor understandably omits a section (§ 7) deleted by Husserl himself from the second edition, the discussion of attention (§ 19), and several sections bearing on a doctrine significantly revised in Ideas I, namely, his account of the matter of an act and its underlying presentation (§§ 24-26, 28-31), and sections bearing on naming and judging in connection with founding presentations (§§ 33-36). Probably in view of Husserl’s own later rejection of his doctrine of categorial representation, the editor has largely omitted this discussion (§§ 54-58) from the abridgement of the Sixth Logical Investigation. One has to be less sanguine, however, about the omission of the chapter on consistency (§§ 30-35) and of passages dealing with degrees of fulfillment, including illustrations, in the chapter on levels of knowledge (§§ 12, 18-21, 24). Otherwise, however, the editor has retained most of the substantive sections of this important investigation, including the very valuable appendix to it. These omissions should make users of the abridged edition wary, of course. Yet insofar as there is a need for an abridged edition, Moran has for the most part done a creditable job of retaining Husserl’s important discussions.